The Rhythm of Thought: Art, Literature, and Music after Merleau-Ponty

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Jessica Wiskus, The Rhythm of Thought: Art, Literature, and Music after Merleau-Ponty, University of Chicago Press, 2013, 168pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226030920.

Reviewed by John Carvalho, Villanova University


This is a beautiful book. We can forgive minor distortions in a detail from Paul Cézanne's Mont Sainte-Victoire (1902-04) adorning its cover because the blues and purples dominating the reproduction and bleeding onto the end papers as a wash of lavish violet are so inviting that they make it difficult to resist the book sitting on a table in front of you. And when you accept its invitation, you are treated to the inner beauty of the book's composition: ten chapter which do not proceed in a straight line to a thesis supported by argument but which continuously circle back on one another, generating a theme that resonates in each of them and sustains the lot of them as a whole work. The composition of the book and the theme it performs for us is musical in its form and its content. Hearing the theme in the central chapters of the book, in fact, requires more than just a casual acquaintance with music and music theory. For those with an ear for it, their knowledge of music will be rewarded with careful and informed analyses and with a special insight into the theme of this evocative volume.

This is not a book primarily for musicologists, however. It is importantly a book for philosophers with more than a casual acquaintance with the writings of Maurice Merleau-Ponty and who, despite their attention to those writings, have not noticed the presence of music in his work. Indeed, the most significant achievement of this book is what it contributes to our understanding of Merleau-Ponty's mature thinking by drawing on these remarks about music. This accomplishment is unprecedented in the literature. Jessica Wiskus has a much more than casual acquaintance with music, and she uses what she knows and clearly loves about music to identify texts which help her make sense of what has puzzled some commentators about Merleau-Ponty's philosophy to the present day. As Wiskus reads him, ontology is the final, non-teleological aim of the thinking Merleau-Ponty left unfinished at his unexpected death in May 1961, and, according to Wiskus, what Merleau-Ponty has to say about music significantly informs our understanding of that ontology.

The books begins with reflections on the non-coincidence of metaphor in the rhythm of creative language, drawing on Merleau-Ponty's references to the poetry of Stéphane Mallarmé as giving an insight into the importance of non-coincidence in his own writings. It proceeds, in the next chapter, to discuss non-coincidence in terms of depth in the paintings of Cézanne. In the following chapter, non-coincidence turns up, again, in a discussion of memory in Marcel Proust's À la recherche du temps perdu. The same theme, not yet defined, is given another variation in a discussion of silence in Claude Debussy's Prélude à l'après-midi d'un faune. Wiskus, next, returns to depth in Cézanne and introduces the notion of what Merleau-Ponty calls style and Cézanne terms motif, which, she says, is not an object in the painting but a possibility or latency in the field in which we find an object painted in depth. She goes on to develop this idea of style in yet another variation of her earlier discussion of Proust, introducing, now, the idea of a "curious 'subterranean logic'" or institution at work in the depth of memory that is so important in Proust's great work (75).

So, following Wiskus and her attempt to understand what Merleau-Ponty may have been thinking at the end of his life, the invisible motif is what allows Cézanne to make a bit of nature visible on his canvases, and the subterranean institution of love is what guides Marcel in his pursuit of the "true Albertine." When she returns to the Debussy, it is to the intervalic relations of tones across the whole piece that make the never stated theme of the Prélude stand out. The theme resounds, she says, in the non-coincident tritones, "an inherently unstable sonority," coming together to form fully diminished seventh chords and, more generally, in a disruption, introduced in the very opening of the piece, expressed as a change in the melody from G♮to G♯ (79-82). This unstated reality in the Prélude is, now, reinforced, in the chapter that follows, with a discussion of the "little phrase" and the musical idea in Proust. And this discussion is followed by a return to Debussy and the suggestion that the musical idea there, as Merleau-Ponty describes it in Proust, is "'the opening of a dimension that can never again be closed' . . . not a 'positive thought' . . . but a 'negativity or absence circumscribed' (109). The book, then, concludes with a return to poetry and rhythm, introducing the ideas of synesthesia, recollection and, finally, resurrection as the movement of expression "instituted as the rhythm of Being" (122). That expression is thought realized as philosophy and art, and the "rhythm of thought" is found in art and philosophy that coheres non-coincidentally and resonates fully with the rhythm of Being.

Speaking in this last chapter of Proust's narrator finding "something more" in the mobility and luminosity of his vision of the twin steeple of Martinville, Wiskus writes, "this 'something more' . . . is transcendence . . . . One does not grasp or possess this 'something more'; one participates, performs, and brings it to expression" (122). There is a pleasure in this expression, says Wiskus. Music expresses this pleasure most directly, and, in this expression, "Being enacts being" (123). According to Wiskus, music expresses this enactment and institutes this pleasure, because music offers rhythm and "rhythm lies at the origin of all art" and, finally, all philosophy (123). In fact, Wiskus concludes, philosophy discloses an ontology proper to it not by grasping but by performing the depth and rhythm of Being. Quoting a fragment from the unedited working notes for The Visible and the Invisible, Wiskus writes: "Here philosophy participates in what Merleau-Ponty sets as its true task: 'the expression of what is before expression and sustains it from behind" (123, emphasis in the original).

What does this mean? Wiskus appears to have in mind something like the following. We do not find transcendence in what is expressed but only in what is non-coincident in that expression, what called for expression and coheres only in those expressions that take the form of art defined as those expressions that resonate with non-coincidence. Painting, literature and music, which do not resonate with Being (which is non-coincident in all beings), are not truly but only nominally art. Likewise, philosophy that is truly and not just nominally philosophy is called to express this non-coincidence transcendence, and authentic philosophical expression will resonate with a transcendence that resonates in beings themselves and sustains beings and philosophy as such. Philosophy so expressed will have a special relation to truth defined not as a correspondence with reality but as a non-coincident transcendence with the real.

This is a very different account of what philosophy is and does than we ordinarily expect to find in a book for philosophers, and neither Merleau-Ponty nor Wiskus offers an argument in defense of this account. Such an argument, on what appears to be Wiskus's view, could only seek to possess what, it is supposed, cannot properly be possessed. The book, by its own thinking, can only give expression to what calls for expression, what "calls for thinking." And this is useful for one reading of what Merleau-Ponty may have been on his way to thinking in the last days of his life. It is not, however, the only thing Merleau-Ponty may have been thinking, and it is not obvious that his thinking about music has as much to do with what Wiskus supposes he was thinking.

The working note from which Wiskus cites the text about expression, above, is dated January, 1959, and titled "Origin of Truth," the title Merleau-Ponty first intended to give his work.1 There, Merleau-Ponty also writes that philosophy is a matter of "effecting a passage" from being itself to the being of the life-world, Lebenswelt, the term Husserl coined, and which Merleau-Ponty says he uses to refer to "the incarnate subjectivity of the human body."2 He writes that he must "rediscover the Lebenswelt logos" and "only then" would he "be in a position to define ontology and to define philosophy," only then "the definition of philosophy would involve an elucidation of philosophical expression itself."3 Whether this is the "true task" of philosophy or only what would become of Merleau-Ponty's philosophy once he had discovered the logos of the Lebenswelt, which appears to be the immediate task of his philosophy, is not entirely clear. But this appears very different from being called to express in the first instance what is "before all expression and sustains it from behind."

Further, what Merleau-Ponty has to say about musical composition and performances is limited and nowhere sustained. In places, Wiskus cites texts where Merleau-Ponty gives expression to what he means by the "flesh" to amplify her own observations about music. This is not quite a circularity, but Wiskus often draws from telling expressions about the "flesh" to give an account of music that in turn amplifies what she takes Merleau-Ponty to understand by "flesh." Thus, the "flesh" gives an account of music that, so construed, gives an account of flesh. Moreover, Merleau-Ponty's understanding of music is captivated by his fascination with "the little phrase" in Proust. It is not clear from any of the texts Wiskus cites that Merleau-Ponty had anything near the command of music that he is recognized as having with painting and literature. That Wiskus should find in Merleau-Ponty resources for making good sense of Debussy is a fine and welcome result. It is just not clear that her understanding of Debussy does as much for our understanding of Merleau-Ponty.

So, one quibble is that Wiskus does not engage other interpretations of Merleau-Ponty in giving her own view. She starts from an observation about the non-coincidence of Merleau-Ponty's life and his work, his final thoughts left unfinished and scattered on pages of fragmentary notes, and attempts to take observations about music in some of these notes as the key to what Merleau-Ponty may have wanted to say. She gives a compelling account of rhythm as a temporal non-coincidence, and she advances the view that this is what Merleau-Ponty was gesturing toward in his discussion of the chiasm and the intertwining of the visible and the invisible. She does not argue for this view but gestures toward it in variations on a theme, itself expressed in variations, taken from a discussion of Debussy's Prélude, and run through discussions of Cézanne and Proust. It would apparently violate her claim to authentic philosophy or art if Wiskus had more strongly argued or advocated for her view.

Another quibble is with the way Cézanne, Proust and Debussy stand in for all the art, literature and music referenced in the subtitle to the book. Without acknowledging it, Wiskus holds up these three figures as the epitome of what there is to accomplish in their respective fields. Perhaps she means to suppose that Cézanne is all there is to painting for Merleau-Ponty and those who accept his view as the final word on the subject, and that, likewise, Proust is all there is to literature after Merleau-Ponty's interpretation of his single most important work. But perhaps this goes too far, and, as we've noted, Merleau-Ponty made no extended study of music at all and mentions Debussy only once, in a lecture written and delivered for a French national radio broadcast in 1948 (in which he also mentions Cézanne, Mallarmé and Proust).4

There is a final quibble to be had with the reading of Plato's Meno, which seems to conflate Plato's account of recollection there with accounts in the Phaedo and Phaedrus, but what Wiskus wants to say about memory in Proust does not depend on it. What she says about memory there might have profited from a consideration of what Gilles Deleuze says about Proust in a book Wiskus includes in the bibliography but does not cite in her text.5

Overall, however, as we began, this is a beautiful book. It does not just look beautiful. It is composed beautifully, and it offers interpretations of Debussy's Prélude and Proust's À la recherche, especially, that can contribute to our understanding of Merleau-Ponty's concept of the "flesh." Even if we do not agree with its conclusions about philosophy, art and transcendence, we admire the poetry in the performance of a book that takes this transcendence as its aim.

1 Maurice Merleau-Ponty, The Visible and the Invisible: Followed by Working Notes, ed. Claude Lefort, trans. Alphonso Lingis (Evanston, IL: Northwestern University Press, 1968), editor's note p. 166.

2 The Visible and the Invisible, p. 167.

3 Ibid.

4 The series of seven lectures is now available in translation as Maurice Merleau-Ponty, The World of Perception, trans. Oliver Davis, with a Foreward by Stéphanie Ménasé and an Introduction by Thomas Baldwin (New York: Routledge, 2004). The reference to Debussy can be found in the lecture titled "Art and the World of Perception," p. 74.

5 Gille Deleuze, Proust and Signs: The Complete Text, trans. Richard Howard (Minneapolis: University of Minnesota Press, 2000).