The Riddle of the World: A Reconsideration of Schopenhauer's Philosophy

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Barbara Hannan, The Riddle of the World: A Reconsideration of Schopenhauer's Philosophy, Oxford UP, 2009, 160pp., $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780195378931.

Reviewed by Bernard Reginster, Brown University



Hannan describes her book as “an introduction to the philosophy of Arthur Schopenhauer, written in a personal style” (p. ix). The “personal” character of this introduction might suggest a fresh new perspective on Schopenhauer’s philosophy or a more or less idiosyncratic take on it; Hannan offers a little of both.

A first, introductory chapter is intended to offer an overview of Schopenhauer’s philosophy but focuses mostly on his metaphysics, which is taken up in greater detail in the second chapter. Hannan emphasizes three main themes: the character of Schopenhauer’s idealism, his claim that reality is in itself will (a view she describes as “panpsychism”), and his views on causality and freedom. Here, and throughout the book, Hannan candidly acknowledges many of the well-known difficulties that afflict Schopenhauer’s metaphysics: for instance, his claim that we can know the world as it is in itself, which is difficult to square with his brand of transcendental idealism; his claim that the world is in itself “will”, which appears to rest on a dubious extrapolation from a certain form of self-knowledge; the puzzling ontological status of the Ideas, which are neither phenomena, nor noumena; and his claim that it is possible to achieve “will-less” states of being, which appears to contradict flatly his view that all being is, in itself and essentially, will.

Hannan suggests that at least some of these difficulties could be explained by the fact that Schopenhauer is a “transitional thinker”. For instance, although he officially continues to endorse transcendental idealism, his deep philosophical instincts would pull him away from it in the direction of some sort of realism. This is apparent, for example, in his methodological claim that the phenomenal world manifests, rather than conceals or distorts, the world as it is in itself (pp. 16, 44-51). Hannan also points out that Schopenhauer’s panpsychism begins to look less objectionably anthropomorphic if it is taken to anticipate more recent ideas, such as the understanding of mindedness simply in terms of “intrinsic causal powers” and “reactivity” to stimuli, or the view that the mental/physical dichotomy is not ontologically deep, but represents merely alternative descriptions of the same reality.

Invoking Schopenhauer’s standing as a “transitional thinker” to account for the difficulties of his philosophy is illuminating, however, only if the pull of the different directions between which his philosophy is torn is made apparent. On this score, Hannan’s book misses some opportunities. For instance, Schopenhauer’s problematic view that we have cognitive access to the thing-in-itself and that we know it as will results from the unfortunate combination of two ideas, each of which has, taken separately, something to recommend it. On the one hand, there is the view derived from Kant that objects represented in terms of space, time, and causality are phenomena; on the other hand, there is the observation that I can have two distinct experiences of my own body — as a body, an object among objects, and as my body. In the first case, I represent my body as an object located, like all other objects, in a spatio-temporal causal framework, whereas in the second case I represent my body in an entirely different way, which Schopenhauer identifies as “will” (The World as Will and Representation, II 103-4). Schopenhauer’s mistake, arguably, is to assume that because the experience of my body as mine differs radically from the experience of it as a body, particularly because it is not framed by the categories of space, time, and causality, it must be an experience of this body as it is in itself. (Note that Schopenhauer himself eventually acknowledges that the experience of my body as will remains an experience of it in time [WWR, II 196-7].)

Hannan does offer, along these lines, a useful discussion of Schopenhauer’s observation that the application of the category of causality depends upon the notion of “force”, which he calls a qualitas occulta precisely because it cannot be represented in a spatio-temporal causal framework (WWR, I § 26). All causes are, for Schopenhauer, merely “occasions” for the manifestation of a force, which “first gives to causes their causality, i.e., the ability to act” (The Fourfold Root of the Principle of Sufficient Reason, 67). For instance, it is in virtue of the force of gravity that my releasing my grip causes my pen to fall to the floor. Here too, however, more probing questions might have been raised about the ontological standing of such forces. For although the observation that the concept of cause presupposes that of force for its application has merit, Schopenhauer might be thought to conclude too hastily that forces are reality as it is “in itself” from the fact that they cannot be represented in terms of space, time, and causality.

Hannan devotes the third chapter to Schopenhauer’s moral theory. The bulk of the chapter is devoted to Schopenhauer’s critique of Kantian moral theory, a critique that focuses on two keys ideas of it: the notion of unconditional obligation, and the dignity of rational agency. Her presentation of this critique is unpersuasive largely, I suspect, because her characterization of the Kantian moral theory that is its object is rather superficial. (It appears uninformed by the extensive and illuminating scholarship produced on Kantian moral philosophy in the past twenty years, of which Hannan makes no mention.) Despite the dismissive tone of his critique of the notion of an unconditional obligation, for instance, Schopenhauer actually takes it more seriously, and argues against it more thoroughly, than the bare, question-begging rejection of it that Hannan attributes to him would suggest. Moreover, he presumably should, since the categorical character of moral obligation has seemed to many to be an entrenched feature of our intuitive, pre-theoretical understanding of it, which can hardly be dismissed as incoherent drivel. Schopenhauer himself offers a pointed rebuttal of Kant’s argument for the existence of such obligations (the claim, developed in Groundwork III, that anyone who engages in practical deliberation is implicitly committed to there being such obligations) (WWR, I 523). It is only against the backdrop of this critique that his notorious misgivings about the very coherence of the idea of unconditional obligation could justify an outright rejection of it (On the Basis of Morality, 55-6). Since the idea looks so patently paradoxical, he might be taken to suggest that the burden is squarely on Kant to make a case for it, which he fails to do.

Schopenhauer is distinguished among Kant’s successors for being the first to raise a substantive challenge to his claim that the basis of morality is the dignity of rational agency. In Schopenhauer’s view, the basis of morality is compassion, understood as a concern to prevent or alleviate suffering in all sentient beings. Hannan’s account of this challenge also lacks a proper appreciation of the philosophical force of Kant’s view, and of the subtlety of Schopenhauer’s criticisms of it. Although she alludes to it, Hannan for example does not offer a detailed and compelling reconstruction of Schopenhauer’s demonstration that Kant’s famous test of universalizability fails to show that benevolence is a moral obligation (BM, 89). Indeed, her own considered view favors the least promising — and least plausible — of Schopenhauer’s objections, that the categorical imperative turns out to be hypothetical: “if you want others to be kind to you, be kind to them” (p. 90).

Hannan’s treatment of Schopenhauer’s own positive alternative account of the basis of morality — his theory of compassion — is cursory at best, and simply ignores the many difficulties, indeed the potentially fatal inconsistencies, that afflict this theory. In particular, she fails to appreciate how some of these difficulties are a direct consequence of Schopenhauer’s rejection of the notion of objective value, which is central to Kant’s own account of morality, where it is tied up with the notion of an unconditional obligation. Genuine compassion, for Schopenhauer, must be altruistic, or motivated by a concern for the well-being of others for its own sake. This implies that the compassionate agent must somehow find the well-being of others to be good independently of its contribution to the satisfaction of his own desires. But Schopenhauer rejects any other notion of goodness beyond what contributes to the satisfaction of one’s own desires (a view that plays a motivating role in his rejection of unconditional obligation) (WWR, I 360, 367). He proposes to salvage the altruistic character of compassion by conceiving of it as resulting from a kind of identification: I am motivated to alleviate the sufferings of others because I come to see them as my own.

Nevertheless the precise nature of this identification remains obscure, as does the manner in which it is supposed to preserve the altruistic character of the compassion that depends on it. If identification is numerical, as Schopenhauer often maintains, it is hard to see how the resulting concern for the sufferings of a being now recognized to be oneself could fail to be egoistic. Schopenhauer sometimes suggests that identification is simply qualitative, that is to say, it consists in my recognizing in the other a being that shares my nature and is, like me, susceptible to suffering. It is unclear how such qualitative identification would necessarily motivate compassion, however, since it is also a condition of the possibility of cruelty. Even when such qualitative identification elicits a sense of solidarity with those beings that are, like me, susceptible to suffering, it is still not evident that the resulting concern to alleviate their sufferings would be genuinely altruistic. As Nietzsche once subtly observed, it could be that I am motivated to alleviate the suffering of those beings with whom I share a condition not because I am concerned for their well-being but because I wish to alleviate my own anxiety about my condition by convincing myself that it is not as fragile and vulnerable as their plight might make it appear to be (Daybreak, § 133).

The book’s fourth chapter deals with Schopenhauer’s aesthetic. This is an area in which Schopenhauer has made an interesting and enduring contribution. His most distinctive and most general claim is that aesthetic experience is “disinterested” contemplation: the contemplation of a work of art or of natural beauty instills in the subject a state in which he is no longer agitated by any passion, desire, care, and concern. Hannan points out two evident difficulties with this view: in the first place, it contradicts Schopenhauer’s own official view that all activity of the intellect is dependent on, and made possible by, the will — the notion of disinterested or “will-less” contemplation is therefore a metaphysical impossibility; in the second place, it does not seem borne out by a close observation of aesthetic experience, which arouses the passions as often as it calms them.

To resolve this difficulty, Hannan offers one of the book’s fresh insights. Schopenhauer, she argues, points to an undeniable and important characteristic of aesthetic experience when he emphasizes the fact that one “loses oneself” in aesthetic contemplation, or one “forgets oneself”, and in particular one ceases to be agitated by needs, desires, worries, torments (one achieves a feeling of “flow” as she calls it). Schopenhauer errs in interpreting this loss of self-consciousness as disinterestedness: I can become un-self-consciously absorbed in an activity even though it remains completely will-full. One might have wished for a more detailed exploration of this interesting observation, however, especially since it provides an opportunity to examine a fundamental idea of Schopenhauer’s philosophy that Hannan’s book leaves almost entirely unexamined: the link between self and will, particularly as it figures in the claim that it is insofar as I am a willing subject that I become self-conscious. Contentious though it may be, Schopenhauer actually argues for this view on several occasions (FR 207-212; WWR, II 201-2), and it underwrites his view that the un-self-conscious contemplation achieved in aesthetic experience is a state of disinterestedness.

The treatment of pessimism and resignation in the book’s final chapter leaves the most to be desired. From the outset, Hannan appears baffled by the very idea of a will-less state: since Schopenhauer takes the will to be our very essence, such a state would have to be a metaphysical impossibility. Her proposed alternative, however, is to characterize pessimism as a manifestation of “depression” and, dismissing what Schopenhauer says about “salvation” from it, to argue that his actual life shows it to lie not in will-less resignation but in the expression of one’s nature, even if, as she takes Schopenhauer to believe, this amounts to nothing more than a futile going on “despite the fact that life is terrible and there is no ultimate hope” (p. 143). What is curious about this proposal is not just that it suggests that Schopenhauer would have been better off endorsing a view that, on the face of it, seems to be practically incoherent; but also that it is motivated by an apparent failure to understand his actual (and fairly straightforward) views about pessimism and resignation. A brief examination would show that, far from being mere psychopathology, Schopenhauer’s pessimism is a philosophical conclusion. This conclusion follows from the endorsement of a venerable and widespread conception of happiness as fulfillment, a condition in which nothing is left to be desired, together with the metaphysical claim (for which he actually offers interesting arguments [see WWR, I 312, 319]) that, for beings with our constitution, such fulfillment is actually impossible. Further examination would also show that Schopenhauer proposes “complete resignation”, a condition in which desires are not satisfied but given up, as the best possible alternative to the unachievable fulfillment (WWR, I 360). If, in keeping with her laudable concern to save Schopenhauer from his own metaphysical excesses, Hannan had considered this notion carefully on its own merits, she might have recognized in it at least a psychologically plausible existential aspiration.

Although she emphasizes the “personal” character of her book, Hannan also bills it both as an “introduction” to Schopenhauer’s philosophy and as a “reconsideration” of it. As an “introduction”, the book offers the reader unfamiliar with Schopenhauer’s philosophy a reasonably complete overview, even though Hannan’s treatment of portions of it leaves something to be desired (especially on pessimism and resignation). Those readers already familiar with Schopenhauer’s philosophy who are looking for a fresh “reconsideration” of its major themes could well find Hannan’s discussions of his metaphysics, in what are the book’s strongest parts, profitable. But I am afraid that they will be mostly disappointed by her treatment of his aesthetics and ethics, which tends to be superficial and seems little informed by the relevant scholarship on both Schopenhauer and his most significant predecessors.