The Right of Necessity: Moral Cosmopolitanism and Global Poverty

Placeholder book cover

Alejandra Mancilla, The Right of Necessity: Moral Cosmopolitanism and Global Poverty, Rowman & Littlefield, 2016, 140pp., $31.00 (pbk), ISBN 9781783485864.

Reviewed by Siegfried Van Duffel, Nazarbayev University


Imagine you are hiking and you somehow find yourself lost in a remote area. To make matters worse, a heavy storm erupts and you didn't bring camping supplies. If that wasn't enough, you are also running out of potable water. Luckily, you find a cabin in the woods which will provide shelter and which likely has the life-saving supplies you are in desperate need of. The cabin is locked, but with some force you will be able to enter. Is it morally permissible for you to do so? More generally, is it morally permissible to avail yourself of someone else's property without the consent of the owner if it is the only way for you to save your life?

The latter question was discussed intensely by twelfth-century theologians and canon lawyers. The theologians initially followed Augustine who had proclaimed that good intentions or outcomes cannot justify sinful acts. And since the well-being of the soul is so much more important than the well-being of the body, it is better to starve than to sin. Some canon lawyers, however, came up with a different answer. The institution of property, they reasoned, is a product of human law. It is permitted but not required by natural law. Before the introduction by human beings of private property, everything was common and it was permissible, under natural law, for anyone to use what they needed. A situation of necessity will trigger a temporary return to that state of nature, before the introduction of property rights, and revive the original right of use.

What happened next is perhaps one of the most remarkable phenomena in the history of European political thought. The idea was accepted by all major canon lawyers, by all major theologians and by all civil lawyers. A consensus grew across the Christian world and it lasted for close to five centuries. All the way into the second half of the seventeenth century, no scholar who wanted to be taken seriously could afford to deny that someone in extreme necessity had a right to take whatever he or she needed to save his or her life. The return to the state of nature was by no means the only explanation/justification that was produced in defenses of the right. Nor was there agreement on the precise modalities of the right. But the existence of the right itself was close to an unquestionable truth. In the eighteenth century, however, acceptance of the right declined. In most of the twentieth century, the right that was once an inevitability in our legal and political tradition is remembered only by a few historians of medieval and early modern political thought.

Enter Alejandra Mancilla. The first chapter of her slim book has the revealing title Reviving the Right of Necessity. After going over some of the statistics detailing the gruesome consequences of global poverty, her focus turns to moral cosmopolitanism. One striking characteristic of moral cosmopolitans is that they have been almost exclusively concerned with the question what we -- the wealthy -- owe the world's poor. All the emphasis is on the duties that the wealthy and powerful have toward those who need our help. Neither justice cosmopolitans (like Pogge) nor assistance cosmopolitans (like Singer), however, have paid much attention to the question what the poor themselves may do to improve their plight. We know, however, that the wealthy citizens or countries are not doing nearly enough to help. And the poor are confronted with a whole lot of violence: they are being chased from their squatting places, arrested for petty theft, and incarcerated when they attempt to cross a border in search for a better life. Assuming that the poor have a right to subsistence, it seems only reasonable to ask what they are morally permitted to do themselves to escape undernourishment and unhealthy living conditions. Mancilla takes care to distinguish the defense of a right of necessity from that of subsistence wars and poor-led movements, as well as that of forced assistance. She also distinguishes her approach from necessity in the law by arguing that no legal system considers chronic material deprivation as providing either a justification or an excuse for using the property of others.

Part I provides a discussion of a few historical accounts of the right of necessity. Chapter 2 briefly peruses some medieval sources, especially Aquinas. She finds in those medieval accounts the main elements that return in later authors.

The right is universal; it is triggered by serious need, regardless of its origin and of its duration; it may be exercised even against the will of the targeted resources, openly or secretly, but only as a last resort; it is a transitive right that may be exercised by third parties on behalf of the needy, and it is not conceived as conflicting with property rights, but rather as constituting a built-in limitation of the latter. (p. 39)

The rest of the second chapter is devoted to Grotius. Mancilla criticizes Grotius for not specifying clearly enough what is implied in the 'return to the state of nature'. She argues that Grotius' right of use in the state of nature must be a privilege compounded with a claim of non-interference against others to those things brought under one's possession and required for one's subsistence. But, Mancilla continues, this has implications, like the right to use violence to defend the things that the pauper has taken into possession and the duty of the owner to let the needy use his property, which Grotius never acknowledges. I am not sure why we should assume that a duty of the owner not to interfere with the use of goods necessary for survival is somehow inconsistent with Grotius's system. Grotius might well have thought that the need to use violence to defend one's possession would not arise in his state of nature. However, if it did arise, then it would be because of the (previous) owner violating a duty not to interfere with the possession and/or use by the needy of goods necessary for survival. So the criticism of Grotius seems to depend on an assumption that he would deny what he did not clearly state and on an uncharitable interpretation of his thought.

Chapter 3 brings the reader in record time up to speed with Pufendorf's theory of sociability, his grounding of property rights, and his distinction between perfect and imperfect duties. Not to harm others is required for the preservation of society and is hence a perfect duty, whereas promoting the good of others is required 'only' for the well-being of society, not for its preservation, and is therefore (only) an imperfect duty. Such an imperfect duty seems an unpromising basis for a right, but Mancilla points out, first, that Pufendorf thinks performance of this duty may be enforced by civil ordinance, hence making the imperfect duty perfect; and, second, that the needy persons may take matters into their own hands where such enforcement is lacking. A problem with the first point is that Pufendorf seems to be raising the possibility of enforcement precisely to argue that this possibility would eliminate the legitimacy of taking matters into one's own hands. Mancilla then turns, initially, to Pufendorf's grounding of the right of necessity in the man's uncontrollable pull to preserve himself and, then, to the conditions that Pufendorf imposes for legitimate exercise of the right. Mancilla clearly admires Pufendorf's work, and is keen to defend him against charges of inconsistency. Yet it is puzzling that she brushes relatively easily over his criterion of moral innocence. Pufendorf scolded Grotius for omitting such a distinction and thus allowing a right to be given to "idle knaves" whose vices have brought them into want, and he left it to property owners to judge, even in cases of necessity, whether the poor are "an object worthy of relief".

Part II develops the case for the revival of the right of necessity. In Chapter 4 the right of necessity is justified very straightforwardly, by tying it to the right to subsistence as a "concrete expression" of the latter. This is somewhat vague, and one sometimes gets the impression that these two rights are not always as clearly distinguished as one would like. Mancilla argues that the right to subsistence should operate as an internal limitation to any acceptable system of property rights, as it did in Grotius and Pufendorf. She also argues that in our current world, where property rules do not function to the benefit of all members of society, the application of the right should not be confined to one-off, mostly naturally caused emergencies, like the case of the cabin in the mountains. One puzzling statement (p. 72) is that this claim relies on the empirical assumption that there is one global economic society. In the first chapter, there is a similar statement: "That the needy may stake a claim upon almost anyone is based on the idea that we live in a sufficiently interconnected global economic order." (p. 9) But it remains unclear why this assumption (or fact) of interconnectedness is required to make the claim stick. After all, the right of necessity and the right of subsistence are not grounded on any assumption of previous injustice. In the next section, she explores in more detail how the right of necessity would fill a gap in moral cosmopolitanism and how it can partly solve the problem of the allocation of correlative duties.

Chapter 5 argues that the poor should not only be entitled to take what they need to survive but also things that may indirectly serve to obtain the former, such as money or a piece of land. It then explains that the right is a privilege or liberty to act, together with duties of others not to interfere with the action. The remainder of the chapter outlines three conditions for the right to be invoked, namely that the need must be basic, that no other equally important moral interests are violated in the exercise of the right, and that it is appealed to as a last resort.

Chapter 6 tackles three different overdemandingness objections. A moral principle is epistemically overdemanding if an agent cannot know what the correct action is under a complex set of circumstances. For the right-holder, it may be impossible to know whether the owner of the targeted resources will not be in an equally deprived position after the goods have been taken. For the duty-bearer, it may be hard to gauge whether someone is in a state of necessity. A moral principle can be psychologically overdemanding if it requires huge sacrifices, or under conditions of general non-compliance, or if one's moral character is shaped by imperfect institutions. And, finally, a moral principle can be theoretically overdemanding if it is self-defeating, if what it requires ultimately brings about effects that run counter to its aim or to the values that it is supposed to uphold. Mancilla admits that the exercise of the right might create unwelcome consequences for the duty-bearers and bring unfair results, but nevertheless argues that the moral principle ought to be upheld. In the final chapter Mancilla asks whether granting such a right will do much good in practice, and she points to a few issues that need further exploration.

Overall this is an engaging book which brings a very worthwhile idea with real world implications to a debate of utmost urgency. The text is almost always very clear and the points are usually tightly argued. Only on a few occasions does one get the impression that legitimate questions are not given the space that they deserve. For example, when answering the question whether violence is permitted when people do not fulfill their correlative duties, Mancilla answers with Pogge that resorting to violence is counterproductive and damaging as it gives the perfect excuse to those in power to keep things as they are. The reader is left with the feeling that the question hasn't really been answered. Further on, when discussing duties correlative to the right of necessity, she suggests that we have a duty "not to make those resources inaccessible." (p. 97) But this remains rather vague. Suppose that I live in an area with a high rate of burglaries. It could well be that some of the burglars are people who steal out of necessity, but does that mean that I should keep the doors of my house unlocked? Of course, such problems are incredibly difficult to solve, and they are perhaps the domain of law rather than morality. Still, at times one wishes that the book would have delved a bit more deeply into them.

All in all, these criticisms of passages are mere quibbles compared to the profound achievements of the author. The book delivers a very clearly argued case for a right that has been neglected for too long, a right that should be high on the agenda for all moral cosmopolitans. Highly recommended.