The Right to Believe: Perspectives in Religious Epistemology

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Dariusz Łukasiewicz and Roger Pouivet (eds.), The Right to Believe: Perspectives in Religious Epistemology, Ontos, 2012, 244pp., €89.00 (hbk), ISBN 9783868381320.

Reviewed by John Bishop, The University of Auckland


Do we have the right to religious belief, even if it does not meet 'standard' criteria for justified beliefs of an ordinary empirical or scientific kind? This collection of articles -- arising from a conference in Bydgoszcz, Poland, in 2010 -- makes a useful contribution to the continuing debate between 'evidentialists' and 'fideists', allowing those of us in the English-speaking 'analytical' tradition to hear some unfamiliar voices that well deserve to be heard.

The collection opens, however, with a familiar voice: Peter van Inwagen, in 'Russell's China Teapot', aims to assess Russell's argument for atheism in his 'Is There a God?'. Russell sees an instructive analogy in our epistemic situation between belief in God and belief 'that between the Earth and Mars there is a china teapot revolving around the sun in an elliptical orbit' (15). Can Russell be arguing that, in each case, since he has no reason for belief that a certain entity exists, he is entitled to hold that it does not? If so, as van Inwagen points out, he argues fallaciously: I have no sufficient reason to believe that this fair coin will land heads, yet I ought to assign 0.5 probability to its doing so and should not believe it will not. Our entitlement -- indeed, our obligation -- to reject belief in the orbiting teapot rests on the vanishingly small prior probability of its existence, given our background knowledge. But -- van Inwagen concludes -- we (some of us, anyway) do not have reason to assign a low prior probability to God's existence: certainly we have nothing like the sorts of reasons van Inwagen articulates for our doing so with the teapot hypothesis. One might wonder, nevertheless, whether this -- in itself impeccable -- line of criticism gets to the heart of the difference between the orbiting teapot hypothesis and the God 'hypothesis'. Van Inwagen leaves it open whether he shares with Russell the assumption that the question of theistic belief is to be answered by considering what evidence we have for the existence of an entity of a certain kind. The possibility that the right to believe may be established otherwise is taken up in later papers more sympathetic to a 'fideist' approach.

The second paper remains within the 'evidentialist' camp, however. John Greco's 'Religious Belief and Evidence from Testimony' distinguishes 'original sources of knowledge' from 'means for distributing knowledge' (38). 'Testimony may at least sometimes function to distribute knowledge . . . without requiring inductive evidence on the part of the hearer. In this distributing role the conditions for testimonial knowledge need not be so demanding' (39). There is an ambiguity, however, in claiming that inductive evidence may not be needed for accepting testimony. True, one may justifiably accept testimony on the reliability of the testifier without having direct evidence for the truth of what is reported. But, in order to do so, one ultimately requires direct evidence that the source is reliable. There is sceptical force, then, in 'the argument from luck': what sources I take as authoritative is affected by my historical situation. And if it is claimed that only certain sources have proper credentials -- because of their association with violation miracles -- Hume's argument applies, and the context then requires direct assessment of all the evidence pertaining to a 'miracle' testimony. Here, surely, in Greco's words, 'testimony functions as an original source of knowledge . . . so as to admit information into the system in the first place' (40).

Nevertheless, theistic belief rests on accepting what is handed down as revealed by God, so we need an epistemology of revelation. Co-editor Roger Pouivet's article offers steps towards this. His focus is on a puzzle from an unpublished paper of John Greco: how may revealed knowledge be both the gift of God's grace and also a 'cognitive achievement'? Pouivet agrees with Greco that 'S knows p only if S has gone through the intellectual effort to know p and thus deserves (intellectual) credit for believing the truth regarding p' (47). Pouivet recognises that Plantinga's externalist proper functionalism challenges this claim, and replies that only warranted belief, not knowledge itself, may be held without meritorious achievement (see 49). But this reply fails to appreciate that, for Plantinga, warrant just is whatever has to be added to true belief to yield knowledge: if warrant can be unmerited, so too can knowledge.

Pouivet thinks there is a Thomist solution to his puzzle. On Aquinas's view, assent to a faith-proposition is motivated by sufficient reason ('the authority of Divine teaching confirmed by miracles'), yet this assent is not elicited by one's own understanding of the truth at issue, but rather through divine grace. The assent of faith is meritorious (provided it is 'formed faith', issuing in the right kind of practical commitment), but Aquinas does not classify this assent as knowledge, since its certainty is not demonstrative certainty. Contemporary epistemology, of course, does not place so strong a condition on knowledge. So, though Aquinas would say that assent to revelation is a grace-enabled venture beyond knowledge, his account does hold faith to be both dependent on grace and a meritorious grasping of the truth that may count, on contemporary accounts, as knowledge.

Michel Bastit's 'Faith as an Epistemic Good according to Aristotle' reminds us that Aquinas deploys an Aristotelian conception of faith, as belief held through trusting a speaker. Bastit explains Aristotle's account of rhetoric as persuasive speech that, by expressing the speaker's virtues and competence, enables the hearer to grasp truths through accepting the speaker's authority. We may thus, especially in the sphere of 'human affairs', gain by faith truths beyond 'science': 'to ask evidence of faith is to make an epistemological mistake, confounding science, insight and faith; [through] lack of education, one demands a mode of knowledge that does not fit the subject matter' (66). Faith is, accordingly, 'a normal human phenomenon indispensable for the whole of our practical and even theoretical lives' (70).

How does this account extend to religious faith? Bastit says that 'religious faith appears as an answer to and an effect of the proposal of divine rhetorical speech referring to knowledge about God, that is to say, a good for man that entails his flourishing as well as his salvation' (71). The claim is, then, that human flourishing requires assenting to, and acting upon, certain truths as revealed. We may thus need to venture beyond what we can understand: but we may not need to venture beyond what our evidence supports. As Locke puts it, 'Faith . . . is the assent to any proposition, not . . . made out by the deductions of reason, but upon the credit of the proposer, as coming from God, in some extraordinary way of communication' (Essay Concerning Human Understanding, Bk IV, Ch. 18, para. 2). When there is adequate evidence for giving 'credit to the proposer', faith meets the evidentialist's requirement. Aquinas and Locke held, of course, that there is such evidence with respect to Christian sources of revelation. Those now inclined to doubt this claim, and thus to suspect that faith needs defence against the evidentialist presumption, may be helped by Bastit's closing reflections on Aquinas's giving the highest epistemic honours to a faith that adheres to revealed truth through love. Is there here grist for the mill of the Jamesian, who endorses the claim that our 'passional nature' may 'lawfully' decide options that cannot be intellectually settled on the basis of evidence?

Clarity about the voluntariness of faith is the aim of Cyrille Michon's 'Aquinas and the Will to Believe'. In Michon's view, Aquinas's understanding needs amendment by employing the distinction between belief and acceptance due to Jonathan Cohen: 'belief is not voluntary, pure assent is a passive reaction, . . . only acceptance is really under the power of the will, as well as all other actions that [may] be based on [a] belief' (84). Cohen explains acceptance thus: 'To accept that p is to have or adopt a policy of deeming, positing, or postulating that p -- i.e., of including that proposition . . . among one's premises for deciding what to do or think in a particular context, whether or not one feels it to be true that p' (An Essay on Belief and Acceptance, Oxford: Clarendon Press, 1992, p. 4). So we must distinguish, from the state of believing that p, the action of taking p to be true in one's reasoning. As Michon observes, one may accept a claim without believing it true, and, conversely, not accept a claim one does believe. To the aspects of voluntariness implied in Aquinas's account -- namely, the practical exercise of formed faith, and the unresisting reception of grace in assent (it is an axiom, surely, that grace can be resisted?) -- Michon urges that we add the action of taking the propositions of 'the Faith' to be true in practical reasoning. With faith thus understood, the certainty of faith is illuminated by reconstruing it 'as implying the full determination of the acceptance. . . . one may entertain doubts about this or that aspect of the divine revelation while at the same time accepting without hesitation the articles of faith, for which one would die rather than commit apostasy' (82-3). Faith's certainty is not felt conviction excluding doubt, rather it is conferred in the believer's wholeheartedly taking the revelation to be true as the foundational practical orientation for his or her life.

Michon's appeal to acceptance is exactly what is needed to understand William James's 'justification of faith' in 'The Will to Believe', the subject of Piotr Gutowski's 'To be in Truth, or not to Be Mistaken?'. James holds that 'we have a moral right to believe on insufficient evidence from the point of view of science' (89-90). What James defends is the action of accepting the truth of a religious belief in our practical reasoning. This will be permissible, however, just when the 'option' concerned is 'genuine', which, as Gutowski emphasises, is a situationally relative feature. My option to believe in the Christian God, for example, will be genuine if and only if what matters, and matters vitally, is whether or not here and now I practically commit myself to the truths of the Gospel. Facing such a 'forced' option, I am entitled to settle it, even though I contravene Clifford's principle that 'it is wrong, always, everywhere, and for anyone to believe anything upon insufficient evidence'.

Gutowski has tried to reconcile James's claim with van Inwagen's position in another article with Clifford's principle as title (in J. Jordan and D. Howard-Snyder, eds, Faith, Freedom and Rationality, Lanham MD: Rowman and Littlefield, 1996, pp. 137-153). Van Inwagen thinks we must respect Clifford's evidentialism, but may dispute what it is to have 'sufficient evidence': in particular, people may differ in their evidence on religious questions because some have better insight than others. Gutowski suggests that we might 'ascribe to James the theory that I have [a] right to believe on the basis of what I regard as evidence (assuming that I and you form opposite beliefs in [a] field where both of us are experts)' (93). I doubt that James would welcome such a rapprochement, however, given his rejection, noted by Gutowski, of any 'rationalization' of the 'passional' causes of religious belief.

As the title of his essay in this volume suggests, Gutowski endorses James's suggestion that commitment beyond the evidence is legitimate because it is permissible to prefer gaining truth to avoiding error. But James also says that, since the religious option is forced, 'we cannot escape the issue by remaining sceptical and waiting for more light . . . We do avoid error in that way if religion be untrue; we lose the good, if it be true, just as certainly as if we positively chose to disbelieve.' Gutowski quotes this remark (see p. 90), but does not recognise that it renders otiose what he apparently regards as a key argument. (Of course, one avoids mistaken belief by suspending judgment, but deciding not to commit risks failure of alignment between one's commitments and reality as much as deciding to venture does.)

Gutowski acknowledges the standard objection that James's defence encourages a plurality of faith-commitments, including undesirable ones: were it 'directed to religious fanatics, it would be inappropriate' (97). But how are fanatical commitments to be excluded? Gutowski's position is that faith-ventures, though beyond rational certification, must nevertheless be held undogmatically -- 'the right to form beliefs . . . does not mean the right to maintain them or maintain them in unchanged form' (100). Believers must be concerned for the overall coherence of their commitments with what is generally known in the realms of both fact and value. As James says, '[faiths] ought to live in publicity, vying with each other . . . it is only when they forget that they are hypotheses and put on rationalistic and authoritative pretensions, that our faiths do harm' (quoted pp. 97-8, from Pragmatism).

Two papers explore combining evidentialism (assumed to favour atheism or agnosticism) with conceding a right to religious practice. Renata Ziemińska's paper is a fascinating discussion of Sextus Empiricus' stance towards religion. Sextus, however, advocates suspension of judgment, not as a dogma but as 'a way of life without beliefs' (150). That way of life accepts religion. Ziemińska quotes Sextus as saying of those who adopt his scepticism: 'following ordinary life without opinions, we say that there are gods and we are pious towards the gods and say that they are provident' (154). (Yet Sextus thinks that to stick one's neck out and say that the gods exist is to be impious, given the force of the argument from evil!) Dariusz Łukasiewicz, the other co-editor, uses his paper to set out Marian Przełęcki's view that, though it is irrational to hold religious beliefs, doing so may have good consequences and may therefore be justifiable under the 'ethics of charity'. Przełęcki seems to have moved from the Cliffordian view that allowing oneself to believe without sufficient evidence is potentially contaminating to a compassionate view that allows 'indulgence' in religious beliefs in times of stress, and, therefore, more generally (since one can hardly switch them on and off).

Jacek Wojtysiak's 'Do we Have the Epistemic Right to Believe in Jesus?' takes a 'mixed' approach to its title question, appealing both to a priori assumptions about the nature of God and to testimonial evidence about the life of Jesus (the strategy of Richard Swinburne in Was Jesus God? (Oxford University Press, 2008)). Urszula M. Żegleń's 'Religious Beliefs in the Face of Rationalism' sets out a conception of rationality broad enough to include as rational a Christian faith-commitment understood as enabled by grace and as providing an 'ultimate' explanation of human existence beyond anything achievable by science -- a conception defended in several papers already discussed. Jan Woleński's 'Logic, Right to Unbelief and Freedom' is the only paper to consider the political right to believe, arguing that 'there are no conceptual reasons in the conjunction between deontology and political rights to exclude unbelievers from [the] benefits [of religious tolerance]' (147).

I found Fabien Schang's 'Believing the Self-Contradictory' hard to follow, and will not commit myself to any report about it. The remaining three papers went beyond the epistemological ethics of belief theme of the book. Gabriele De Anna's instructive paper, 'Can there be Supernaturalism without Theism?', contains valuable reflections on varieties of both naturalism and theism, and argues against Tooley's objection to Plantinga (in their debate in Knowledge of God (Oxford: Blackwell, 2008)) that showing naturalism to be inadequate does not suffice to establish theism. Gerhard Heinzmann's paper reflects on the importance of 'dialogical altruism' in forgiveness: the idea is that forgiveness is directed towards the restoration of relationship, a process which requires a 'dialogical' interaction between offender and victim that involves mutual recognition of the human dignity of each. Stanisław Judycki's 'Transfiguration of Human Consciousness and Eternal Life' is a speculation about the possibility of a 'transfigured' form of consciousness in which the self 'will experience directly its unique relation to all objects' (235).

Typographical errors and idiomatic flaws (especially the use of articles) are rather frequent -- to the extent that I wondered whether an earlier edited draft had inadvertently made it to publication. Yet comprehension was not generally impaired, and some divergent idioms were charming (for example, Michon's writing that he 'will not quarrel Aquinas for' a certain alleged oversight (76)). Readers will, I am sure, share my own enjoyment of discovering highly stimulating work by several philosophers not widely published in English.