The Right to Exploit: Parasitism, Scarcity, Basic Income

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Gijs van Donselaar, The Right to Exploit: Parasitism, Scarcity, Basic Income, Oxford UP, 2009, 195pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780195140392.

Reviewed by Jonathan Wolff, University College London



This is an exceptionally well-written book: both stylish and pursued at an unrelentingly high level of argument. Yet the topic of the book is, initially, something of a puzzle. The title The Right to Exploit builds up certain expectations; the sub-title ‘Parasitism, Scarcity, Basic Income’ somewhat defuses them. So, to be clear, the book, disappointingly for some no doubt, is not a bracing defence of the right to exploit. Indeed, for reasons I shall explain, I’m not even convinced it is a discussion of exploitation. Rather it is an account of how a succession of authors have left themselves open to a charge that their proposals allow parasitism.

To set the scene, the first chapter opens with an insightful and entertaining discussion of the idea of ‘the abuse of rights’ illustrated with the English case Mayor of Bradford v. Pickles. Pickles had lawfully diverted a stream so that he could later charge a high price for allowing it to flow into the town reservoir. The court held that he had not violated the law: an otherwise legal act does not become illegal simply because of its motive. Continental law, however, does by contrast recognize the legal category ‘abuse of rights’. Mr Pickles is relevant because ‘He is trying to be a parasite: he is trying to exploit other people’ (p. 4).

The account of ‘parasitism’ — used interchangeably with ‘exploitation’ — relied upon in this book is derived from David Gauthier and reads as follows:

A parastic (property rights) relation exists between A and B if in virtue of that relation A is worse off than she would have been had B not existed or if she would have had nothing to do with him, while B is better off than he would have been without A, or having nothing to do with her, or vice versa (p. 4).

This does capture the notion of a parasite rather nicely. The tapeworm in a dog’s stomach leaves the dog worse off and the tapeworm better off than if the two had never come into contact. Thus parasitism is a type of asymmetrical relation, contrasted in the biology textbooks with symbiosis, and in ordinary life with reciprocity, or productive exchange, where both sides are better off through the presence of the other.

The relation between parasitism and exploitation, however, is not straightforward. Take the standard examples used to challenge libertarian theories. I am drowning and you chance by in your boat. You refuse to rescue me unless I sign a deed handing over all my property. Many people would, I am sure, regard this as a case of exploitation, yet it does not meet the conditions for parasitism. I would be even worse off, if you had not come by. At least now I have an option to save myself, costly though it is. In response one might try to do something fancy with the hypotheticals - perhaps we should compare the case with one where many boats pass by - but this is not discussed. What makes exploitation so puzzling and challenging is that exploitative relations are often mutually beneficial.

And this is not the end of it. The description of the asymmetrical relations captured by the definition as morally unsatisfactory parasitism becomes more problematic when one considers the position of those unable to support themselves who rely on help from others. If a rich person is taxed to support a poor widow and her starving children then the widow and children are parasites by this definition. Some will welcome this description, but others, I am sure, will be troubled. At the least we are likely to deny that the relationship is one of exploitation, or that there is anything wrong. Therefore parasitism is not sufficient for exploitation or for ‘wrongness’. Now it may be that the answer is contained in the words “property rights” in Gauthier’s definition: that the discussion of the book concerns only parasitism based on property relations between individuals, and taxation and charity are thereby excluded, but still further discussion is needed.

It is clear that van Donselaar’s real concern is to rule out the possibility of someone manipulating a situation in order to make parasitism possible, as in the case of Mr Pickles. But the definition of parasitism says nothing about the motives or origin of the relation between the parties. Much later in the book van Donselaar introduces two further concepts as categories of parasitism: ‘usurpation’ when one party takes control of an asset but has no independent interest in it other than being able to use it to extract rent from others (e.g., those who register the best web address for a major company simply to sell it on) and ‘usury’ where one does have an independent interest in the asset but nevertheless can make more by hiring it out or selling it to others. But as far as I could see there was no discussion about the ethics of forms of parasitism (tax and charity, for example) that do not fall into these categories, which is surprising in a book that displays such analytic power. Van Donselaar is aware that his analysis does not address the claims of the needy, but his response is that this will have to be left for another occasion (p. 14). For reasons I will explain later, I find this a significant gap.

Chapter 2 is a detailed discussion of Gauthier’s theory presented in Morals by Agreement (1986). Gauthier’s theory is essentially that justice amounts to rational bargaining for mutual advantage. But of course the notion of mutual advantage presupposes a baseline for comparison. This chapter critically explores a range of considerations and unexpected complications that arise in the selection of an appropriate baseline, which for Gauthier is Locke’s proviso that one may not improve one’s position by worsening that of another. Much of the chapter consists of detailed, insightful and persuasive, internal critique of Gauthier: sound enough, as far as I can judge. There is always a risk to work of this sort. The more convincing the critique, the less obvious it is that there was reason to have paid such attention to the work in the first place. But a number of important points come through. One is that while theorists are keen to emphasise the potential benefits of social co-operation, nevertheless there are also many ways in which interaction with others can create problems, such as in the competition for scarce resources or the existence of externalities, such as ‘downstream’ effects, which in some cases would be entirely innocent if it were not for effects on other human beings. More surprising and very illuminating is the argument that the Lockean proviso is inconsistent with permanent property rights, as rights will always be liable to adjustment in the face of changing circumstances: essentially changing facts about the most efficient use of resources.

The Lockean proviso is also the star of Chapter 3, ‘The Benefit of Another’s Pains’, here though, at least at first, in the context of a fascinating exegesis of Locke’s text. The particular target is Jeremy Waldron’s unconventional reading in which it is denied that the Lockean proviso should be read as stating a necessary condition for appropriation. Van Donselaar marshals a range of considerations to show the implausibility of such a reading. His account is a valuable contribution to Locke scholarship, including a detailed textual appendix.

The chapter moves on to the discussion of Robert Nozick — another enthusiast of the Lockean proviso. Here van Donselaar raises a previously under-explored aspect of Nozick’s theory as developed in Anarchy, State, and Utopia: how to make sense of Chapter 4’s concerns with ‘unproductive exchange’ given the natural rights libertarianism of Chapter 7. A natural rights perspective would seem to render questions of productivity of exchange, or otherwise, entirely irrelevant, yet Nozick devotes a great deal of space and ingenuity to the topic. My own feeling is that Nozick’s intellectual curiosity led him to discuss those things he was interested in, pursuing them where they lead, without being concerned very much about how the pieces of the discussion fit together. Van Donselaar nevertheless does a good job of showing how Nozick’s use of the Lockean proviso does not avoid the type of parasitism that a concern with unproductive exchange might prohibit. But at the same time an interesting discussion of Nozick’s generally neglected account of unproductive exchange provides helpful materials in attempting to generate a theory of just exchange that avoids parasitisim,

In summary, the first half of the book argues that three theorists, Gauthier, Locke, and Nozick, who all appear to oppose parasitism, face difficulties in proposing theories of property rights that will avoid it. In the end the difficulty is that once permanent property rights exist it will often be the case that ‘rent’ beyond compensation for the pains of production can be extracted by a canny property owner.

The second half of the book changes tack, looking at theories of a much more egalitarian nature, most notably Philippe van Parijs but also Ronald Dworkin, exploring their accounts of justice from t he point of view of a concern, once more, with parasitism. Here we move to a strange but familiar world of islands, auctions and individuals defined in terms of their preferences for bundles of income and leisure. Van Parijs’s proposal for an unconditional basic income for all citizens and, especially, his justice-based arguments are the target of Chapter 4, and in Chapter 5 attention turns to Van Parijs’s innovative discussion of the idea that jobs can be regarded as scarce resources and taxed to build up a basic income fund. Although the argument in these chapters is characteristically intelligent, detailed and sensitive to unexpected difficulties and complexities, the conclusion that basic income leads to parasitism is hardly a surprise, for this has been the main objection all along.

Van Parijs, of course, is not Gauthier or Nozick. Is it a fatal objection to his theory that it permits parasitism, as defined here? Van Parijs set out to propose and defend an approach to justice that would have greatly beneficial effects for the poor, needy and dispossessed. By assigning everyone a range of property rights the needy can acquire an income by renting their resources to those who can make good use of them. This has several advantages over the means-tested welfare state which it would replace. Essentially the critique comes to the claim that Van Parijs’s proposals can never be fine-grained enough to make a distinction between the needy and the lazy. Now it is possible to argue about whether this is a morally important distinction, but let us suppose it is. Still one might defend Van Parijs’s theory on the grounds that, although imperfect, it is the best of all possible theories in that it provides a justice-based proposal for the support of the needy. The cost may be that it allows parasitism in the objectionable sense but any defender of basic income knows that this is a vulnerability.

The best response to this reply is to show that Van Parijs’s is not the best of all possible theories by producing a better theory. Van Donselaar takes us just a few steps in that direction. In Chapter 6 he proposes ‘the rule of Maimonides’ which instructs us to ‘give an equal amount to every claimant or the full amount of his claim, whichever is smaller’. In essence this unusual principle rules out allocating property to those who want it only to be able to extract rent from others. This is a very neat attempt to avoid parasitism, although, as van Donselaar admits, in the form stated it still allows what he calls usury and so is not entirely satisfactory. Yet he fails to develop the theory in any detail, citing lack of space. Now, this is a slim book, and I don’t know what constraints he was under, but there are surely discussions that could have been cut to make more room if he had made the choice to do so.

Aside from problems with the rule itself, the difficulty is that nothing at all is said about the needy. A consequence of the rule of Maimonides — which as van Donselaar himself points out was not intended by Maimonides as a general theory of distributive justice — is that the needy will have to rely on charity (and thereby apparently be parasites by the definition offered) or starve. Clearly van Donselaar believes further principles are required, but in their absence we cannot begin to judge whether his approach, as a whole, is better than Van Parijs’s. It may simply be impossible to design a theory to which there are no good objections. We are not left in a position to judge.

My hope is that van Donselaar will soon let us see his proposals for his complete theory of justice. His power of argument is exceptional and his philosophical imagination very rich. He has discovered unexpected difficulties and complexities even in widely discussed proposals, and has given us a sketch of the beginnings of something new. If he can follow up with a broader set of principles, defended against the type of criticisms to which he has subjected others, it will certainly be worth a great deal of attention. This current work is much more of a specialized taste, certainly a contribution to a number of debates but much less of a contribution to their resolution.