The Rise of Realism

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Manuel DeLanda and Graham Harman, The Rise of Realism, Polity, 2017, 160pp., $22.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781509519026.

Reviewed by Paul M. Livingston, University of New Mexico


Construed as a definite description, the title of this book refers to the trend of some recent discussions and projects with roots in recognizably “continental” philosophy, including, in particular, those that have been grouped under the partially overlapping headings of “speculative” and “new” realism, “speculative” materialism, and “object-oriented” and “flat” ontology. Despite having diverse influences and trajectories, these projects have in common a determining commitment to one variety or other of realism about the entities and phenomena of the world. This is understood as excluding the various versions of idealism and anti-realism that have often characterized positions and methods within nineteenth- and twentieth-century “continental” philosophy, ranging from Kantian and post-Kantian subjective, linguistic, absolute, and transcendental idealisms to more recent projects of social, linguistic, and cultural constructivism. For the recently arisen “continental” realisms, a common methodological starting point is to reject the claim of a sharp and ontologically significant divide between the “human” and “non-human” domains. Thus, the nature and relations of objects, entities, and phenomena are not to be understood in terms of any kind of distinctively subjective, linguistic, or social form of human perception, cognition, or representation, but rather on their own terms, completely indifferent to the question of our knowledge of, or access to, them.

The book itself presents a dialogue between two philosophers, Graham Harman and Manuel DeLanda, who have long designated themselves as realists in this general sense. In a series of topical chapters, the two articulate the programmatic, methodological, and metaphysical commitments underlying their respective projects and compare them with each other, while also describing en passant their relationships of influence by, and divergence from, more familiar “continental” philosophical positions and methods, especially those of phenomenology and Deleuze’s “virtual” ontology. Readers with an interest in the contemporary applications or transformations of these projects, as well as those sympathetic to the broader call for a renewal of realist metaphysics in continental philosophy, may find these discussions illuminating, and suggestive of at least some of the more specific forms such a contemporary development might take.

Both Harman and DeLanda bring to the discussion a variety of specific and, at times, idiosyncratic programmatic commitments that each has developed over the past roughly two decades in a series of books. Harman’s “object-oriented” ontology, first expounded in the course of a heterodox realist reading of Heidegger in his 2002 Tool-Being, seeks to characterize objects in general not simply in terms of their various and dynamic relationships to each other but also, and crucially, in terms of the way in which each (as Harman argues) essentially “withdraws” from the totality of its relations, and indeed from any possibility of a complete and exhaustive understanding of it. As Harman points out here, this conception has a precedent in Husserl’s characterization of the intentional object of a perceptual act as something that is not exhausted by any number of its perceptual adumbrations or partial appearances (34-36). But rather than construing the object, in idealistic fashion, as an ideal limit of these partial presentations, Harman reverses Husserl’s position into a realism about the object itself as the essentially obscure substrate for all of its (human and non-human) relations. This leads him to endorse at a basic ontological level the existence of “substantial forms” or singular essences which, although bearing significant structure, are not directly knowable or “exhausted” by any variety of epistemic (or other) external relationship (pp. 19, 55-56). On this basis, Harman rejects all attempts to reduce objects to simpler constituents (this includes both atomistic and non-atomistic varieties of materialism), as well as all attempts to “overmine” objects by explaining them simply in terms of their position within broader holistic and relational networks.

DeLanda’s realist project, by contrast, has its philosophical roots in Deleuze’s differential ontology of dynamical processes, and in the realist attitude Deleuze takes toward the formal and structural conditions for their arising, evolution, development and transformation. Deleuze understands the broader conditions for the evolution and transformation of systems as “virtual” in the sense of structurally preceding and determining their dynamic actualization in particular concrete processes and events, but nevertheless as fully real in that they are themselves situated wholly within material reality. As DeLanda emphasized in Intensive Science and Virtual Philosophy (2002), in describing these virtual conditions Deleuze draws centrally on the mathematics of Riemannian n-dimensional manifolds. As he argues, extending Deleuze’s own ontology in a more explicitly formal-mathematical direction, this naturally invites the description of dynamical systems in terms of their nonlinear movement in phase spaces characterized by bifurcations, attractors, and other distinctive topological features. This framework is not only indifferent to the human-inhuman distinction but also, DeLanda argues, can account for dynamic processes of temporal change and emergence across a widely diverse range of scales, domains, and subject matters. In A Thousand Years of Nonlinear History, for instance, DeLanda innovatively applied nonlinear dynamics to the modeling of the last 1000 years of world history, arguing for a complex dynamics of interaction between human, geological, and biological phenomena, processes, and events, rather than any directly linear narrative of progress or straightforward historical development. Here, DeLanda argues that such a nonlinear dynamics of virtuality, if applied generally, can subsume the seemingly stable identity of objects and forms within a broader explanation of the dynamic mechanisms of their novel emergence, homeostatic self-organization, and possible transformation (p. 89).

As Harman and DeLanda recognize, in both recent “analytic” and “continental” discussions, “realism” is a term that has been used in a wide variety of different ways and in connection with various non-equivalent projects and claims. In 1963, Michael Dummett influentially suggested understanding commitment to realism about a domain as commitment to the bivalence of statements about it; on this understanding, realism amounts to the claim that each such statement is determinately true or false, independently of our knowledge, thinking, or conception of the entities involved. In his 2007 A Thing of This World: A History of Continental Anti-Realism, Lee Braver influentially added to Dummett’s definition a number of other specific commitments that have defined varieties of “realism” within analytic discussions, applying them to consider what he treated, in their terms, as the contrasting anti-realist positions of Kant, Hegel, Nietzsche, Heidegger, Foucault, and Derrida. For Braver, the defining commitments of realism include, among others, the commitment to the mind-independence of “the world,” understood as a fixed totality of objects, the commitment to a correspondence account of truth, and the claim that there is one “true, complete description of how the world is.” For the “speculative” and “new” realisms that form the immediate context of DeLanda and Harman’s discussion, however, the most centrally determining commitment is generally not any of these positive ones, but rather the rejection of what Quentin Meillassoux termed “correlationism”: the view that neither “thinking” nor “being” can be understood except by considering the purportedly correlative relationship between them. Expressing their central agreement on the rejection of correlationism, Harman and DeLanda accordingly supplement Braver’s original “realism matrix” with a further claim that both see as decisive for the types of realism that they wish to endorse. As formulated here, this is the claim that “the relationship of the human subject to the world is not a privileged relation for philosophy,” (pp. 28-29) and that the ontology of the world is thus to be described wholly in terms of objects and processes “in themselves,” rather than anything conditioned by human subjectivity, agency, knowledge or language.

While thus agreeing in broad terms on this rejection of all “human-centered” approaches, DeLanda and Harman nevertheless diverge quite significantly, not only with respect to details, but also with respect to the methods and overall aims of the global ontologies they propose. Whereas Harman centers his ontology, as we have seen, on objects understood as self-standing and stably enduring entities, each characterized by its own always elusive but individuating singular essence, DeLanda’s is essentially an ontology of dynamic historical processes, with individual entities or “objects” emerging only as temporarily stable configurations of these broader dynamics. Closely related to this is the two philosophers’ disagreement about the methodological role of natural-scientific, a posteriori explanations. Whereas, for DeLanda, these explanations are central to accounting for the change and development of phenomena in the world, for Harman what is primary is rather the “aesthetic” paradigm of the object as underlying, but not being reducible to, the totality of its appearances or relations (p. 149).

These divergences on basic terms and methods lead the two philosophers to also disagree sharply on categories which might reasonably be considered central to the question of the “realist” or “anti-realist” status of any global metaphysical project. For example, while DeLanda considers his position overall a “materialist” one in that it accepts only entities that are “immament to patterned matter-energy,” (p. 23) Harman argues that there can be “forms without matter” (one example he gives is that of fictional objects), wondering more broadly whether there is “any point” to the notion of matter at all “other than as a feeble explanation of the difference between real and imaginary things” (p. 19). Relatedly, the two philosophers disagree about essences. Whereas, for Harman, the ultimate basis of the individuality of a single object is to be found in the reality of its individual essence or essential form, for DeLanda, all essentialist explanations of concrete phenomena are to be eschewed in favor of structural and dynamic accounts of their historical evolution and transformation. Again, somewhat similarly, while DeLanda finds any denial of objective time “anathema” (pp. 150-51) given his thoroughgoing situation of entities within the historical and temporal contexts of their objective emergence and articulation, for Harman, time “belongs . . . purely to the sensual realm” in an extended sense of “sensual” (Harman uses the term to refer to a broad variety of relationships between objects, rather than simply to object-human or object-subject relationships) and is thus to be referred to the spatial “network of relations and non-relations between objects” (p. 123) rather than to the “real itself” (p. 124).

These divergences on the questions of matter, essence, and time, as well as the significant methodological innovations that distinctively mark both projects, raise questions about the extent to which the two should in fact be seen as representing a unified positive position deserving the label “realism” at all. Indeed, the most central “realism-”defining commitment that both philosophers share is not any positive substantive claim about the nature or relationships of mind, language, or the world, but rather the negative and methodological claim (not included in Braver’s original “matrix”) of the disqualification of consideration of “the human subject” or its relationship to the world in philosophical ontology. But this claim does not by itself provide any particular guidance as to the positive form or shape a descriptive ontology in accordance with it should take; and, accordingly, it is not entirely clear, especially given the marked methodological and thematic differences between the two projects, that there is anything like a unitary “realist” ontological project here at all.

There are also questions to be raised about the actual relationship of the types of “realism” defended here to the more familiar metaphysical and ontological positions that have recently borne that name. Harman and DeLanda actually agree in rejecting or finding not centrally relevant most of the traditional defining commitments that have structured recent analytic discussions, including those of bivalence, correspondence truth, and the possibility of a true and complete description of reality. Philosophers who frame the question of realism in terms of these commitments have most often understood the central issues as ones about the structure of language or linguistic meaning, reference, or truth in their bearing upon the world. By contrast, Harman and DeLanda agree in rejecting any primarily linguistic or logical framing of the question of realism, and repeatedly formulate the central issue, instead, as that of the privilege of the “human subject” or its perceptual or epistemic relationship to worldly objects, phenomena and processes. While this has the effect of foregrounding the strict separation of epistemology from ontology on which both philosophers insist, it may also tend to obscure or elide the broader potential relevance of linguistic, logical, and semantic considerations (as opposed to simply epistemological or anti-epistemological ones) to the question of the definition or articulation of realism itself. At the same time, in the context of a broader discussion of the stakes and implications of realism and anti-realism, it threatens to leave out or distort the distinctive contributions to the issue of those (including not only analytic philosophers, such as Dummett and Putnam, but also “continental” ones such as Heidegger) who do not formulate these questions centrally as ones about the “subject/object” distinction or relation at all, but rather situate it more broadly in the context of global considerations about the overall nature and structure of language, meaning, or truth.

This book consists mostly of a series of point-by-point comparisons between the commitments arising from two highly specific projects that are worked out in detail only elsewhere, and does not contain any introduction or other explanatory apparatus to help familiarize the reader with the two philosophers’ previous work. For this reason, those who are not already familiar with these specific projects may find the reasons for many of the positional and comparative commitments articulated here obscure or under-explained. On the other hand, those who antecedently sympathize with one or both of these projects, or more broadly agree on the contemporary need for a more “realist” development or supplementation of the methods of twentieth-century “continental” philosophy, will find in this discussion suggestive new developments and articulations of some of the many possible meanings of philosophical “realism” today.