The Robust Demands of the Good: Ethics with Attachment, Virtue, and Respect

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Philip Pettit, The Robust Demands of the Good: Ethics with Attachment, Virtue, and Respect, Oxford University Press, 2015, 281pp., $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198732600.

Reviewed by Paul Hurley, Claremont McKenna College​


Philip Pettit is a stalwart member of the shrinking group of impersonal consequentialists, those who maintain that the right action is determined through appeal to the impersonal, agent-neutral evaluation of outcomes. Notoriously, Bernard Williams and others have charged that such a theory of right action undermines rich goods of attachment, virtue, and respect, alienating agents from relationships of friendship and love and undermining the integrity of virtuous character in the relentless pursuit of agent-neutral value. Pettit's project in this book is first to present a detailed, unified account of such rich goods together with their supporting rationale, then to argue that the proper cultivation of such goods provides no particular problem impersonal consequentialism. Indeed, despite its reputation as the worst theory for fostering such goods, Pettit makes the case that such consequentialism emerges as a leading candidate for the best.

He devotes the first half of the book to developing his accounts of rich goods of attachment (Chapter 1), virtue (Chapter 2), and respect (Chapter 3). Pettit's claim that all such rich goods have the same basic structure is central not only to his accounts of these goods, but to the rationale that he offers for valuing them (Chapter 4), and to the general problem that he takes such goods to present for any theory of the right (Chapter 7). In what follows I will briefly sketch Pettit's account of rich goods, the rationale that he offers to support them, and his arguments reconciling such rich goods to a consequentialist theory of the right. Along the way I will raise a set of interrelated challenges to each of these central components of his account. This book contains a great deal of additional value that cannot be addressed here, including Pettit's fascinating analysis of the relevant asymmetries between good and evil that explain the Knobe effect (Chapter 6), and his intriguing accounts of the Doctrine of Double Effect and the Principle of Action and Omission (Chapter 5). The rich, comprehensive view Pettit develops in this volume will more than repay engagement by philosophers working in normative ethics, and metaethics, and the theory of action.

Rich Goods

Pettit argues that goods of attachment such as friendship and love, goods of virtue such as honesty, kindness, and justice, and the good of respect all share a common structure. Each rich good of each type, he argues, provides a corresponding thin good robustly. For example, the rich good of friendship provides the thin benefit of favor robustly, the rich good of honesty provides the thin benefit of truth-telling robustly, and the rich good of respect provides the thin benefit of restraint or non-interference robustly. The question, of course, is what it means to provide such thin benefits robustly. Pettit's intriguing answer is that what I value when I value your friendship or honesty or respect is a disposition on your part to provide such thin benefits that is "resilient enough to survive situational shifts," (24) assuring me of the thin benefit both actually, "as things actually are," and counterfactually, "as they would be under certain variations." (46) The honest person is disposed to tell me the truth not just when it is personally advantageous for her or promotes the impersonal good, but also when doing so is disadvantageous for her and inconvenient, and even in many cases in which doing so fails to promote the overall good. I value this disposition in her as an end in itself, and the good that such a person gives me, the rich good of honesty, far exceeds the thin benefit of truth-telling.

Pettit takes it to be clear that we do value such rich goods, with their robust provision of their respective thin goods. It will be useful to tease out certain contours that he takes to be shared by the dispositions that are central to all such goods. Each such rich good has, on the one side, a priming constraint. Thus, the primer for the virtue of honesty is my need for information, and the honest person will both recognize such a primer and, in the presence of such a primer, recognize a pro tanto reason of honesty to tell me the truth. On the other side, each such rich good comes with a filter or proviso such that failure of the proposed action to pass cleanly through the filter -- the support constraint -- indicates that counter-vailing reasons may outweigh this pro tanto reason, reasonably inhibiting action. The patterns of behavior associated with such rich goods, Pettit argues, are "reinforced via a social norm" that will tend both to be internalized, i.e. "people do really approve and disapprove in the pattern that others expect," and public, i.e. "it will be a matter of shared awareness in the society" that people internalize such norms. (65)

Pettit suggests that such an account of rich goods demonstrates the importance of distinguishing between acts and actions. If you tell me the truth for opportunistic reasons, and Jones tells me the truth out of reasons of honesty, you have each performed the same act (telling me the truth), and it is the right act to perform in the circumstances. But you and Jones have performed completely different actions because your respective actions, as opposed to your acts, have their disposition-dependent properties essentially. Jones performs the action of controlling for truth-telling, hence through his action I robustly enjoy the thin benefit of truth-telling. You perform the action of controlling for your self-interest, hence your action does not robustly bestow upon me the benefit of truth-telling. I am vulnerable to deception at your hands whenever it furthers your interests. The acts performed by you and Jones are the same, and equally right; the actions performed by you and Jones are different, and only one of them is good. This brief characterization cannot even begin to do this ingenious act/action distinction justice, but it provides the conceptual space for consequentialists and others to capture the disposition-dependent value that can otherwise seem to be the exclusive domain of virtue ethicists and Kantians.

Pettit is surely right that friendship and other rich goods "are among the most important goods that we can enjoy in human life," (140) and is surely right that dispositions merely to show me actual favor, or tell me the truth, or not interfere with my liberty in one's actual interactions with me do not amount to friendship, or honesty, or respect. But does the addition of Ptolemaic epicycles to such dispositions, such that they lead you to show me not just actual but counterfactual favor, truthfulness, etc., suffice to bestow what is of value in the relevant rich goods, or is something more involved? It is certainly true that two friends, people who enjoy a reciprocal relationship of caring, trust, mutual support, and intimacy towards each other, will manifest dispositions to provide counterfactually robust favor. But if some stranger were permanently conditioned by a Clockwork Orange-like procedure to be disposed to provide me robustly with the thin good of favor, perhaps with even greater reliability than my friends do, although I may value such robust favor I would not take myself to have gained another friend. Nor would I consider the stranger to be "giving me" the good of friendship that I receive from my friends. Such considerations suggest that perhaps what is valuable about friendship, love, justice, mutual respect, etc. is not simply the dispositions to provide corresponding thin benefits robustly; indeed, that the value of such dispositions taken by themselves fails to capture the importance of such rich goods in human life.

The Rationale for Rich Goods

We now have in place Pettit's account of the rich goods of attachment, virtue, and respect. But why do we value such dispositions to provide the relevant thin goods robustly? As an agent-neutral consequentialist, Pettit would seem to confront a particularly acute challenge to providing such a rationale. Promoting a thin benefit on traditional consequentialist accounts involves maximization of its expected realization. But robust provision of such benefits is probabilistically insensitive across variations, hence is not likely to maximize expected realization of thin benefits. Why, then, should an agent-neutral consequentialist foster such rich goods, with their robust provision of thin benefits? The obvious fallback for the consequentialist is to argue that we value the relevant dispositions to provide thin benefits robustly as the best available means of maximizing expected realization of the relevant benefits. But such a rationale, Pettit suggests, would make a mockery of our value for friendship and honesty. (114)

He argues instead that the rationale for valuing such dispositions of attachment, virtue, and respect is that they protect us "against the free exercise of will on the part of others." (121) We value security from imposition of harm by others. The dispositions of attachment, virtue, and respect protect us from such harm (denial of associated benefits) by others. Crucially, they not only reduce the probability of your harming me, they reduce my vulnerability to your harming me. (130) Alternatives that reduce probability while leaving me vulnerable leave you with "full deliberative control of whether to harm me." (130) Thus, they fail to secure the relevant value of security understood as protection from vulnerability to the will of others. Socially inculcated dispositions to robustly provide the requisite thin goods do provide us this security, hence it is these dispositions themselves that we value: "Your virtue guards me against your deliberating in a way that tracks the interest of people in general, not my interest as someone who occupies a certain position in relation to you."(133)

To accept such a rationale for rich goods is to support the cultivation of such dispositions in others. But it is less clear why such acceptance supports the cultivation or continued maintenance of such a disposition in oneself. From the standpoint of my own interest and the interest of those close to me, it may well seem preferable to cultivate more complex dispositions in myself that render me able to pursue my interests more effectively despite making others vulnerable, particularly if I can do so without detection. Similarly, shouldn't recognition of such a rationale for cultivating dispositions to provide rich goods lead the consequentialist saint to cultivate within herself complex dispositions to maximize the overall cultivation of such dispositions in others, when necessary through dishonest and disrespectful action?[1]

The Good and the Right: The Guidance Problem

We have now sketched Pettit's account of the rich goods of attachment, virtue, and respect, and his rationale for valuing dispositions to provide such goods. This puts us in a position to confront, with Pettit, what he characterizes as the Guidance Problem, the problem of reconciling rich goods and their rationale with a theory of right action, and in particular with a consequentialist theory of right action. The particular difficulty for a consequentialist such as Pettit, recall, is that the virtuous and respectful person cannot justify telling me a lie or interfering in my basic liberties to maximize truth-telling or non-interference overall. Yet such vicious and disrespectful actions seem to be precisely the right actions for the agent-neutral consequentialist.

Pettit's strategy is to argue that all other theories of the right are partners in guilt, i.e. that every theory, including virtue ethical, contractualist, and Kantian candidates, confronts an apparent tension between "acting under the guidance of the theory of the right," and "acting out of dispositions of . . . virtue, and respect." (215) Whatever principle of right one takes to be compelling, it must on pain of implausibility "often require acting out of dispositions of attachment, virtue, and respect," (219) hence it must offer a procedure "whereby agents might routinely act out the required dispositions, yet be guided at the same time by the general principle." (219) Because no such approach can plausibly prescribe that the relevant principle of the right "should actively guide agents in their deliberations," (219) lest it undermine action from these required dispositions, plausible alternatives must maintain instead that the relevant principle should function as a "standby guide" that "is invoked to determine what to do only under specific contextual cues." (219) Just as a cowboy is engaged in the action of controlling his cattle even though he only intervenes when a member of the herd wanders off track, and otherwise just stands ready to intervene, so too the moral agent will "operate in general under independent controls . . . of attachment, virtue, and respect," and only invokes "the principle of right in deliberation when there is contextual evidence that this is necessary." (219)

Any plausible theory of the right must be such that people will "let dispositions of attachment, virtue, and respect shape their behaviour in a more or less independent manner," (220) but suspend such dispositions when they encounter "signs that in a particular case those dispositions might lead to a breach of the principle of right adopted." (220) Hence, given the impossibility of any principle of the right actively guiding an agent with such dispositions in his or her deliberations (219), requiring instead such standby guidance, Pettit suggests that agent-neutral consequentialism is the best theory of the right to provide such standby guidance.

Such an account raises puzzles of at least two different sorts. First, it is not clear how such a solution to the guidance problem avoids the objections that have been raised against indirect act consequentialism over the last several decades. We can see the apparent difficulty by returning to Pettit's cowboy analogy. The cowboy's standby guidance is manifested by his intervention whenever a member of the herd veers off in the wrong direction. The analogous standby guidance in the case of the consequentialist principle of the right would seemingly involve intervening whenever the dispositions to robustly provide benefits fail to maximize the overall good. But if I intervene whenever such a disposition veers from promoting the best outcome, suspending it whenever "acting on a disposition lacks suitable support and fails the criterion of the right," (220) then won't the sorts of cases in which I suspend dispositions include those in which by lying or acting disrespectfully I can promote truth-telling and respectful interaction among others? Yet on Pettit's own account to suspend the dispositions in such cases is not to have the dispositions at all, undermining the value of rich goods.

If, as Pettit suggests, every theory of right action suffers from the guidance problem, then such problems of indirection are problems for all theories of right action, not for consequentialist theories in particular. But are other theories such partners in guilt, equally susceptible to the guidance problem? Virtue ethicists will find it odd to encounter the suggestion that their theory of the right must accommodate virtuous dispositions since their theory is that acting rightly is acting virtuously. There is no need for an additional theory of the right to provide guidance, standby or otherwise, on such a theory of the good of virtue. Pettit notes this, but prefers an approach that tackles the guidance problem "head on." (219) Yet why prefer an approach that tackles the problem "head on" to one that does not have the problem at all?

A related point holds for Kantian and many contractualist accounts. To see why, consider the nature of the pro tanto reasons of virtue and respect recognized even on Pettit's account by people who have the dispositions we value. They are not reasons only to interact honestly, justly, and respectfully with some particular person or persons to whom one is partial, but reasons to interact this way with anyone. Moreover, as the relevant social norms attest, they are put forward as reasons that each person should recognize to tell the truth, uphold the claims, and respect the liberties of each person in his or her interactions with them. For Kantians and for many contractualists there is no place for suspending such impartial reasons or the dispositions to act on them when they conflict with the theory of right action because these are the fundamental reasons of right action singled out by such theories, reasons that often constrain persons from acting either to promote the best outcome for them (partially) or to promote the best agent-neutral outcome (impersonally).

But Pettit denies that such reasons can be the fundamental impartial reasons of right action that such contractualists and Kantians take them to be, arguing that when you act on such reasons of honesty, virtue, and respect, you "act in a relatively partial way," and "grant me a special status and give me a certain advantage over others." (206) Kantians and most contractualists will of course deny both that such reasons are partial at all and that they in any way grant a special status.

They are partial, of course, if one takes impartiality to be impersonality -- a conception of impartiality articulated in terms of the agent-neutral value of outcomes. And this appears to be Pettit's view. All reasons, he argues, are fundamentally reasons to promote outcomes, (224-26) and they are either personal reasons to promote outcomes or impersonal reasons to promote outcomes. (198) Personal reasons are agent-relative, partial reasons to promote outcomes; impersonal reasons are agent-neutral, impartial reasons to promote outcomes. Our seemingly impartial reasons for each person to treat each other person honesty, justly, respectfully, etc. do not appear to be either. They appear to be impartial but not impersonal reasons, and agent-relative but not personal reasons. Moreover, they appear to be reasons to act or not act, but only in certain cases do the acts they provide us with reasons to perform appear to be promotings of outcomes.

On Pettit's account of reasons, such impartial but not impersonal reasons cannot be what they appear to be. They must be either personal or impersonal reasons to promote. Because they are not impersonal reasons, he takes them to be reasons of the former sort -- personal, agent-relative, partial reasons to promote. Because such reasons are "relatively partial," but you must be "relatively impartial and impersonal in seeking to act rightly," (206) there is a problem of when principles of right action require us to suspend such relatively partial reasons because they do not further the "relatively impartial and impersonal" quest to act rightly. This is the guidance problem in its clearest form. But it appears to be a distinctive problem, or at the very least a distinctively serious problem, for theories of reasons and of right action, such as Pettit's, that do not allow for fundamental reasons of right action that are impartial but not impersonal, and do not allow reasons for acting that are not reasons for promoting some outcome.

For Pettit, reasons for right action are fundamentally reasons to promote outcomes, and are distinctively impartial/impersonal reasons to promote outcomes.  But then the seemingly impartial reasons that people with virtuous and respectful dispositions take each person to have to interact with each person honestly, justly, respectfully, etc. cannot be fundamental reasons of right action. The best account of such reasons of honesty, justice, and respect may well be that they reflect dispositions that society inculcates in us through social norms, dispositions that we have a rationale for valuing (at least in others), but must be prepared to suspend when they conflict with the impersonal principles of right action. Within the context of such assumptions, that is, Pettit's ingenious account may well be the best available of the value of rich goods, and it may well be that the guidance problem cannot be avoided, only mitigated through some form of standby guidance, and a consequentialist theory may well provide the best path towards such mitigation.

[1] The question, in short, is whether Pettit's rationale fails Christine Korsgaard's "Transparency Test" (The Sources of Normativity, Cambridge University Press, 1986).