The Role Ethics of Epictetus: Stoicism in Ordinary Life

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Brian E. Johnson, The Role Ethics of Epictetus: Stoicism in Ordinary Life, Lexington Books, 2014, 200pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780739179673.

Reviewed by Margaret Graver, Dartmouth College


This work, a revision of the author's 2007 dissertation, is an in-depth study of the distinctive and in some ways original ethical system developed by Epictetus in the early decades of the second century C.E. In contrast to the accounts of Stoic ethics given in Cicero and Seneca and in the doxographical tradition, Epictetus shows little interest in defining the cardinal virtues or in the theoretical absolutes expressed in the so-called "paradoxes," e.g., that all fools are insane or that only the sage is free. He concentrates rather on the particular nature of each person and on a small group of injunctions concerned with the individual's integrity of volition, attitude toward externals, and relations with others. The organizing principle, Brian Johnson argues, is Epictetus' developed understanding of the ethical roles each person has been assigned by god to play: as a human being; as a parent, citizen, or friend; as a scholar, lawyer, or athlete; or, like Socrates, as one divinely appointed to a particular task. It is these multiple and overlapping roles that determine our specific obligations, and the real work of ethics consists in grasping what each demands and adjudicating conflicts among them. By thus personalizing the demands of ethics to the traits and situations of individuals, Johnson's Epictetus establishes a meaningful distance between moral knowledge and genuine moral worth -- and in so doing abrogates a central principle of early Stoicism.

The book's nine chapters both explicate what is straightforward about Epictetus' role-based ethics and address a series of interpretive puzzles connected with it. After outlining the conception of an ethical role and flagging the relevant terminology, Chapter 1 works out the fundamental role each person must fulfill as a human being, the basis for such universal responsibilities as rationality, trustworthiness, sociability, and piety. Chapter 2 then explores the criteria by which one may identify further specific roles. These include one's personal characteristics, specific social relations, choice of career, and sometimes indications from oracles and the like. Once roles are identified, they can be interpreted in terms of appropriate actions (kathēkonta) by referring to the criteria formally termed consequentiality (akolouthia) and reasonableness (to eulogon), both of which figure prominently in other Stoic contexts also (Chapter 3).

With these points established, Chapter 4 takes up the status and relative importance of the three "topics" (topoi) that constitute Epictetus' educational program: desire and aversion, appropriate action, logic and assent. According to Johnson, it is in the third "topic" or phase of the curriculum that Epictetus situates the rigorous discipline that would enable an advanced pupil to attain epistemic perfection; i.e., sagedom. Crucially, however, it is not necessary to proceed to the study of logic and assent in order to become morally good. One can in fact be a good person, kalos k'agathos, on the basis of right beliefs (ortha dogmata) about how to act, without need of right reason (orthos logos) or security of judgment (asphaleia). "Accordingly, while the third topic may indeed help to perfect our judgments, it is not clear that this perfection improves our ethical standing any further" (76).

From here Johnson goes on to address the possibility that an individual's roles may come into conflict with one another (Chapter 5), and then to analyze with some care one difficult passage, Discourses 1.2, in which a multiplicity of roles appears to be at issue (Chapter 6). Epictetus there considers the case of a slave who feels it does not befit him to hold a chamber pot for his master, but yet finds it reasonable to evade the beating that will punish refusal. The philosopher's answer is ambiguous: "You are the one that knows . . . how much you are worth to yourself." Drawing on what has been established thus far about individual roles, Johnson argues that Epictetus means for his interlocutor to determine whether the role of slave genuinely belongs to him. If it does, he should hold the pot; if not, he shouldn't.

The admission that roles may conflict requires some discussion of how such conflicts may be resolved. This important issue is addressed in Chapter 7. No explicit instructions are to be gleaned from the Discourses on this point; at most, we are provided with some resources. We may, like the chamber-slave, seek to determine which of our roles we most identify with; or we may arrange our lives so that our roles are compatible after all, as Crates managed to be both Cynic and husband by choosing the like-minded Hipparchia to marry. Or, in some cases, we may refer to an external authority; e.g., a military commander, a ship-captain, or God.

Chapter 8 takes a side trip into the Panaetian theory of roles laid out by Cicero in De Officiis, a model frequently invoked as a parallel or even as a major influence for Epictetus. While recognizing certain obvious similarities, Johnson leans hard on the structural features that give Cicero's scheme a purpose and rationale quite different from what we find in Epictetus. Narrowly subordinated to the cardinal virtue of decorum (Cicero's term here for sōphrosunē), the Panaetian roles provide the criteria that social agents must consult in determining how to win the approval of others; Epictetus' more fluid account, by contrast, encompasses all aspects of a life and defines appropriate actions for all kinds of agents. Epictetus' is thus a more robust conception suited to reframe Stoic ethics as a whole (Chapter 9). Mediating between the "top-down" approach of traditional virtue theory and Epictetus' own "bottom-up" observations about the practical reasoning of ordinary agents, it enables even the latter, non-wise individuals to know themselves and fulfill themselves as virtuous human beings.

Everyone who reads Epictetus is aware of his keen intelligence and of the depth of his familiarity with earlier Stoic thought. Because of the unsystematic presentation of the Discourses, however, and even more because of the philosopher's ironical and sometimes elliptical manner of expression, it can be quite difficult to pin down exactly what he means in particular passages. In most instances, Johnson proves to be a responsible and effective guide, most notably in a first-rate exposition of the re-mapping of logical terms onto the domain of role-based ethics (48-53). Concerning certain passages, however, his interpretations give the appearance of having been pulled off the mark by his own distaste for what he terms the "abstract and forbidding virtues of Stoicism" (3). A troubling instance is his treatment of the third educational "topic" of Diss. 2.17 and related passages. That Epictetus seems not to encourage the pupil who wishes to study logic cannot be taken to imply that logic is of use only to sages; still less that ordinary agents have no call to try to perfect their mechanisms of assent. What he rejects is only the first-century fad for logic studies of a particular kind, viz., of formal logic to the exclusion of practical ethics. Seneca voices the same complaint in Epp. 45, 48, 49, and 111, texts that might profitably have been adduced here.

Also problematic -- though argued with admirable care -- is Johnson's reading of the chamber-pot episode. Here Epictetus' merciless sarcasm demands much of the reader, and Johnson's account of options available to the interpreter is helpful in any case. But it is a mistake to reject Adolph Bonhoeffer's "deflationary" reading, in which acquiescence in the task degrades one's very humanity. The slave's belief that it is reasonable to evade a beating does not make it so in this instance: the criterion of right belief cannot have been met by one who can contemplate "selling himself" (1.2.11) at any price. This does not make the chapter "a hymn to the Stoic sage" (115). Agrippinus, Helvidius Priscus, and Epictetus himself are examples of non-sages who embrace the full implications of their role as ethical agents. In aspiring to sagedom, they set an example for others who have not yet learned to aspire.

To some extent, Johnson's reading of Epictetus as heterodox depends on the choices he makes at these two interpretive junctures; for that reason, his revisionist claims go rather too far for my sense of this philosopher. But the boldness with which his position is stated does not make the book any less valuable. A strong and consistent reading of an ambiguous text is always welcome, and Johnson's effort to think through what a role-based ethics might entail is of philosophical interest regardless of its fit with Epictetus' ancient project. Readers at all levels will benefit, too, from Johnson's consistently patient and clear manner of laying out the issues and from his meticulous references to related passages elsewhere in the corpus. Meanwhile, the reading of De Officiis 1 has independent value and should be consulted as a supplement, if not a corrective, to available studies of that important passage.