The Role of Technology in Science: Philosophical Perspectives

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Sven Ove Hansson (ed.), The Role of Technology in Science: Philosophical Perspectives, Springer, 2015, 258pp., $129.00 (hbk), ISBN 9789401797610.


Reviewed by Shane Nicholas Glackin, University of Exeter


As a teenager, like many people fascinated by the sciences but possessing no practical aptitude for them, I became an eager consumer of pop-science books. And in the mid-'90s, there was one subject on which aficionados of the genre were virtually unanimous; you simply had to read Longitude, Dava Sobel's bravura and best-selling account of the quest to develop a clock precise enough for the purpose of calculating longitude at sea. Yet I found Longitude curiously unsatisfying. Whatever it was about, I felt, it wasn't about science; the story it told wasn't about any deepening of our understanding of nature, but rather the gradual practical improvement of processes and mechanisms we already understood fully.

Approximately this distinction -- between "science" and "technology" -- remains intuitively appealing even as philosophers of science and technology uncover numerous objections and counterexamples to its neat formulation. It's this border territory, and the engrossing history of concepts, techniques, and devices both illicitly smuggled and overtly imported across it, with which the current volume is concerned. And the long quest for a sufficiently accurate timepiece, in fact, plays a surprisingly large role in the story it tells.

This is brought out particularly in the historically-focussed early chapters, which focus on the ways that technological advances and technological thinking -- so far from simply "applying" science -- have shaped and directed our thinking about it. As David F. Channell demonstrates ("Technological Thinking in Science"), the horological inventions of figures like Christian Huygens and John Harrison had a uniquely deep influence on the mechanistic philosophies of figures like Descartes, Gassendi, Hobbes, Boyle, and Leibniz, who in their various ways conceived of nature as a clockwork mechanism with God as the clockmaker. It was this view, in turn, of a mechanical universe to tweak and tinker with which gave rise to the experimentalist philosophies of the seventeenth century and the directions in which science has since developed in their wake.

The themes of the historical influence of technological instruments and experiments, respectively, upon the development of science are taken up in more detail by Mieke Boon ("The Scientific Use of Technological Instruments") and Sven Ove Hansson ("Experiments before Science. What Science Learned from Technological Experiments"). There's little new here in the history of science, but the material works well to contextualise the more contemporary and philosophical work of the later chapters. I had concerns about pacing and coverage, however. Boon's chapter provides a thorough, but "not an exhaustive overview of literature in the philosophy of science that addresses the role of technological instruments in science" (p. 76). It is exhaustive enough, however, that little can be covered in any sort of detail; the Duhem-Quine problem, Popper's claims about theory-ladenness, and Kuhn's notion of paradigms, for instance, are summarised in a single paragraph (p. 58). This level of coverage seems redundant for those already familiar with the material yet too brief to be of much use to those who are not. There's a more extensive treatment of some of Ian Hacking's key ideas (p. 62-4, p. 68-60, p. 72-4), which a newcomer to the philosophy of science will certainly find more useful and informative. But it raises the same question: at which audience is this volume targeted? I don't mean this as a criticism of Boon's piece, which gives a very clear and thorough introduction to its subject area; my concern is that readers who need this comparatively basic material will follow the more arcane and detailed issues in the last section of the volume only with considerable difficulty, while readers interested in those debates may regard the earlier chapters as an unnecessary preamble. For $130, one would hope to find more than half of the book useful.

Part III marks a shift away from the historical relationship between science and technology and towards their current interplay, particularly the role that computers increasingly play in the practice of science. Hacking's Representing and Intervening again occupies a central role in "Iteration Unleashed. Computer Technology in Science", where Johannes Lenhard advances the claim that key features of the mathematical modelling enabled by modern computer technology -- specifically "iteration" and "exploration" -- entail a major conceptual shift regarding the role and nature of models in science and their epistemic consequences. Computer modelling techniques, he argues, "interweave" representation and intervention and so blur the distinction between the two; modelling procedures such as Douglas Rayner Hartree's "self-consistent field" approach in quantum chemistry, and "Monte Carlo methods" in statistics, take advantage of computers' ability not only to process variations on a calculation a massive number of times but also to adjust the set of variations under consideration as the early results come in. The result, he argues, is an "agnostic" view of science that relies more on patterns of resemblance between modelling iterations than on theoretical hypotheses. This is an intriguing claim, but I'd have liked to see it better integrated with the considerable philosophical literature on scientific modelling. The space used effectively duplicating Boon's exposition of Hacking, for instance, might have been better used relating Lenhard's thesis to the claims of philosophers like Nancy Cartwright, Ronald Giere, Richard Levins, or Adam Toon.

Stéphanie Ruphy's "Computer Simulations: A New Mode of Scientific Enquiry?" covers similar territory but does a better job of locating its thesis within the wider literature on scientific models. Simulations, Ruphy argues, differ from traditional scientific experiments by providing us primarily with "modal" knowledge: knowledge not of how the world is but of how it might or could have been. Like Lenhard, Ruphy finds that modelling processes increasingly shift science away from providing "epistemic opacity"; their increasing predictive power comes at the cost of explanatory usefulness. Sitting less easily, thematically, beside these papers in Part III is Russell Powell's "Adopting a Technological Stance Toward the Living World. Promises, Pitfalls and Perils", which investigates the continuing power of technological and artefactual metaphors and concepts in biological discourse. Again, I was somewhat surprised by the connections that weren't made here; Powell makes no mention of the enormous current literature on "mechanisms" in biology, as developed by William Bechtel, Carl F. Craver, Lindley Darden, Peter Machamer, or William Wimsatt. The historical influence of design metaphors in biological theory is similarly rushed through, while the considerable debates about the place of teleology in biology after Darwin are represented by a single citation of Karen Neander. The various explanatory advantages of technological metaphors and analogies are discussed, along with potential pedagogical (if misunderstood, they may encourage creationism) and moral (if misunderstood, they may encourage treating living organisms like artefacts) drawbacks. This is interesting stuff, but like Lenhard's paper it feels as though many of the truly deep and relevant philosophical issues in its vicinity are bypassed or ignored.

I found the debates in Part IV -- where individual papers are followed by other authors' commentaries -- the most stimulating section of the volume, and accordingly, I'll devote the largest portion of this review to them. The first debate directly concerns the intuitive distinction my teenage self drew between the contrasting goals of scientific and technological activity. Erik J. Olsson argues ("Goal Rationality in Science and Technology. An Epistemological Perspective") that the apparent distinction -- science seeks truth, while technology seeks "practical usefulness" -- obscures a deeper unity; both exemplify in slightly different ways the concept of "goal rationality" developed by management theorists. On this theory, "a goal is rational if it performs its achievement-inducing function (sufficiently) well"; thus, a rational goal "should guide as well as motivate action" (p. 177-8). After explicating this view, Olsson uses it to analyse four well-known accounts of the proper goal of scientific enquiry. The first two, due to Peirce and Rorty, reject the idea that science aims at "truth", or "true belief", on pragmatist grounds; "practical usefulness" is the only worthwhile currency. However, Olsson argues, from the perspective of goal rationality the goal of truth is useful precisely because it guides and motivates the mental efforts of enquirers. Likewise, Mark Kaplan's and Crispin Sartwell's arguments against "knowledge" as a goal of scientific enquiry show too narrow an understanding of goal rationality by ignoring the practice-affecting force of knowledge. So, Olsson concludes, while there is "no substantial difference" between the rational goal-setting of science and technology, this fact does not license a collapse of the goals of science into those of technology.

It's a fertile and stimulating line of argument. My worry, though, is that Olsson is not so much broadening the question here as adding a new one. Having concluded that science and technology are indeed distinct enterprises since they pursue different goals, it's not immediately clear why we should be further interested -- or surprised -- to find that they pursue them in the same way or that their standards for a successful pursuit are similar. Something like this concern lies at the heart of Peter Kroes' commentary on Olsson's paper: "the question whether or not true knowledge may be reduced to useful knowledge is not relevant," he writes, "for the question whether the goal of science is the same as the goal of technology" (p. 193). Technology, he argues, aims at "the making of useful things", and while knowledge is frequently a necessary means to this goal, it is no more than that; it is not itself a goal of technology, which can in principle get along quite happily with false beliefs. The key distinction concerns context-dependence -- what is true is true absolutely, but what is useful depends on the context of use. Therefore, technology, concerned with usefulness, is context-dependent in a way that science, concerned with truth and knowledge, is not.

This seems to me a correct conclusion, but an unpersuasive argument for it. What is absolute, one might suppose, is just whatever is the case regardless of context, so what is true will apply in any context whatsoever. Then the features of any context, on which usefulness depends, will include the more general features of the world, not specific to that context, which are the subjects of truth and knowledge. Kroes fleshes his case out by pointing out the ways in which the aims of technological enquiry are continuously "readjusted on the fly" because the required specifications conflict or can't be achieved with the resources available, or because the resources available change, or because market research demands new specifications, etc. The aim of scientific enquiry, by contrast, Kroes takes to remain fixed; scientists simply seek "knowledge" or "the truth" about something. Yet shifting aims and improvised research questions are exactly what Lenhard's paper showed to characterise much contemporary science, while philosophers of science have for several decades debated in great detail the dependence of scientific enquiry upon the immediate context of its material base.

More persuasive is his Humean take on Olsson's borrowings from management theory. Kroes doubts that the theory of goal rationality he uses is truly, as Olsson claims, "substance-independent"; the theory's criteria for rationality were developed precisely to achieve particular substantive managerial goals. But if this is so, argues Kroes, the theory is -- contrary to its proponents' claims -- concerned with a common-or-garden instrumental rationality that can be applied only to means and not to ends. It cannot therefore be usefully applied to the question of the proper goals for science and technology. I found the Olsson-Kroes debate the high-point of the volume. Although neither writer particularly persuaded me, I would enjoy following the second, and third, rejoinders that each might make to the other's position.

The second debate is between Mauro Dorato and Ibo van de Poel. Dorato's paper, on "The Naturalness of the Naturalistic Fallacy and the Ethics of Nanotechnology", begins by delineating various ways that the adjective "natural" is used in ethical disputes before speculating as to the possible evolutionary origins of the tendency to regard nature as morally guiding. Dorato then goes on to apply his finding -- that evolved strategies may not be appropriate to new environments -- to moral questions about the implantation of nanotechnological devices in humans. It's a curious paper, and not just because it seems only tangentially related to the themes of the volume. Dorato acknowledges the fallacious nature of the "naturalistic fallacy" and claims that it can nevertheless be understood as "natural" if we understand it "in the wider context of the Aristotelian notion of 'human flourishing'" (p. 210-11). But Aristotelians do not typically regard the "fallacy" as fallacious at all. While Dorato speculates at the "evolutionary advantage" that such fallacious thinking might have given our ancestors, Aristotelians like Michael Thompson and Philippa Foot repeatedly insist that eudaimonia is not to be identified with Darwinian fitness, nor Aristotle's erga with evolved functions. Moreover, Dorato goes on to characterise flourishing as something "which entails treating persons like ends in themselves" (p. 213) and elsewhere recommends the Kantian maxim "to treat human beings as ends in themselves and not just as means to an end" (p. 218), which no Aristotelian would or could endorse. All these points suggest quite basic confusions in the author's understanding of normative ethics.

Dorato's conjecture regarding the evolutionary advantage of the naturalistic fallacy is similarly problematic. "Since keeping an equilibrium with our natural environment plausibly involves a certain invariance or stability of the niche in which we have lived for millennia," he writes, "we probably evolved a universal attitude . . . to regard any radical change in our relationship with the environment as a potential threat to our survival" (p. 216, my emphasis). Taken out of context, one might guess this was an uncharitable caricature of an evolutionary psychologist's excessively speedy elision between tentative hypothesis and confident conclusion. Argued in apparent earnest, it is alarming. Nor does Dorato make any attempt to show that the pattern of reasoning in question is actually a cultural universal or even that it is anything more than a quite common -- but controversial -- argumentative gambit in several culturally-specific discussions he himself is familiar with.

Van de Poel makes several cogent objections to Dorato's position: that the naturalistic fallacy might still have survival value, so that limits on interventions in nature may still be necessary; that human nature includes the use of technology; and that the concept of flourishing as Dorato uses it is too vague and too contested to serve as a useful guide to action. These are all worthwhile criticisms but seem a bit small-bore; there are significantly deeper problems with Dorato's argument.

On the whole, I enjoyed the volume; though there's nothing of "must-read" status here, the papers are of a generally high standard. In terms of its overall coherence and some of the editorial decisions, there are several issues. The Dorato-van de Poel debate shares little thematic overlap with the other papers, and Maarten Franssen's thoughtful concluding essay, which follows, thus seems a little bit of an orphan. Had it instead followed the Olsson and Kroes papers, it would have served as an excellent cap to that debate. I've also mentioned the considerable divergence in the level of sophistication and prior knowledge the papers apparently expect of their audience. This would certainly be a worthwhile purchase for a library collection, particularly at an institution with a specialisation in science and technology studies or the philosophy of technology, but at this price it's hard to picture the individual reader to whom I'd recommend it.