The Roman Philosophers: From the time of Cato the Censor to the death of Marcus Aurelius

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Morford, Mark, The Roman Philosophers: From the time of Cato the Censor to the death of Marcus Aurelius, Routledge, 2002, 288pp, $21.95 (pbk), ISBN 0415188520.

Reviewed by Wolfgang Mann, Columbia University


excudent alii spirantia mollius aera (credo equidem), uiuos ducent de marmore uultus, orabunt causas melius, caelique meatus describent radio et surgentia sidera dicent: tu regere imperio populos, Romane, memento (hae tibi erunt artes), pacique imponere morem, parcere subiectis et debellare superbos.

(Vergil, Aeneid VI, 847-53)

Others will hammer out the breathing bronze in more supple ways (yes, I’m sure), will draw forth living faces from the marble, will plead cases more eloquently; and the paths of the heavens with a compass they will trace, and tell of the stars’ risings. You, Roman, must remember to rule the nations with your empire— these will be your arts—to place the imprint of decency on peace, to spare the conquered, and to crush the proud.

So speaks the shade of Anchises to his son, Aeneas, in the Underworld, foretelling, in the aftermath of Troy’s destruction, a future of Greek civilization (“Others”) to be followed by a Roman empire—all in an epic which, it has often been thought, was written to celebrate Augustus and the foundation of that very empire by linking it to the mythical, Trojan past and Aeneas’s divine ancestry (Venus). In these famous lines, Vergil gives expression to (the persistent possibility of) a sense of Roman cultural inferiority and belatedness vis-à-vis the Greeks, while at the same time commemorating Rome’s ultimate triumph, which, at least in the ideology of Anchises’ speech, trumps all the cultural achievements of those others. And while philosophy is not mentioned here, it too, surely, belongs among the accomplishments in which the Greeks achieved such preeminence that one may well wonder whether there is any such thing as Roman philosophy, properly speaking.

Morford is convinced that there is. And in this book, which he has “written as a classicist and historian of ideas, with the aim of providing a concise, but not superficial, survey of the writings and ideas of the principal philosophers in the Roman world from the middle of the second century BCE down to the death of Marcus Aurelius in 180 CE” (ix-x), he aims, explicitly, to turn away from the Hellenocentric bias of the historiography of ancient philosophy, and, implicitly, to make up for the neglect of philosophy and philosophical themes on the part of so many historians of Latin literature. In Chapter 1, Philosophia Togata (meaning, “Greek philosophy in Roman dress,” and also the title of two collections of papers, edited by Jonathan Barnes and Miriam Griffin [Oxford, 1989 and 1997], concerned with topics involving “the mutual interaction of philosophy and Roman life”), Morford attempts to define “Roman philosophy,” something that proves not so easy to do, as we will see.

Chapter 2, “The Arrival of the Greek Philosophers in Rome,” begins by describing the Athenian embassy, sent to Rome in 155 BC, to address a particular political matter (14). It was on this occasion that the Academic philosopher, Carneades, conspicuously demonstrated the Sceptic’s commitment to arguing in utramque partem, to arguing on both sides of a (disputed) question—by defending justice on one day, and attacking it on the next. Morford rightly situates this incident in its historical context, making clear that this was, as it were, the first official Roman encounter with Greek philosophy, one which, through its simultaneous display of dialectical virtuosity and, as many Romans saw it, (moral) outrageousness, helped set the stage for the often ambivalent attitude the Romans were to take towards philosophy. To my mind, it is among the more successful chapters, and one that even readers who are fairly familiar with Hellenistic philosophy will read with interest. (However, see also J. G. F. Powell, “Introduction: Cicero’s Philosophical Works and their Background” in Cicero the Philosopher, ed. J. G. F. Powell [Oxford, 1995], pp. 1-35, esp. 11 ff.)

The remaining chapters follow a (roughly) chronological sequence: c. 3,”Cicero and his contemporaries,” c. 4, “Lucretius and the Epicureans,” c. 5, “Philosophers and poets in the Augustan Age,” c. 6, “Seneca and his contemporaries,” c. 7, “Stoicism under Nero and the Flavians,” and c. 8, “From Epictetus to Marcus Aurelius.” As these chapter-headings already make clear, Morford offers an overview of a large number of figures, including many who are not, or are not primarily, philosophers in their own right, but who are influenced by, or in some other way, reflect, philosophical thinking. This range is potentially one of the most exciting features of Morford’s work, since writings by historians of philosophy typically do not discuss, say, Horace or Vergil. But this range, and the fact that there are only 239 pages of text, also makes clear that Morford’s work is, necessarily, an introductory one. Therefore, it needs to be approached as just that, i.e., not in the way one thinks about a scholarly monograph on a single author, or even, on a single movement.

There are, it seems to me, three desiderata which a work of this kind should meet. (i) The writing itself should be clear, straightforward, and, ideally, engaging. (ii) Although the author will, inevitably, need to simplify and streamline the presentation of complicated material, he or she should signal clearly on which points there is large-scale agreement, and on which points there is significant controversy. (iii) There should be suggestions for further reading which take into account the non-expert nature of the intended and likely readership.

Morford succeeds admirably with (i). However, (iii) is a source of real disappointment. In a “Bibliographical Note” (240-41), Morford refers us primarily to the extensive bibliographies in the collections edited by Barnes and Griffin (see above), and, in a blanket way—no details provided, except for especially recommending the volume on Stoicism—to the articles in the relevant six massive tomes (= II. 36, 1-6) of the gigantic encyclopedia, Aufstieg und Niedergang der Römischen Welt; but many of these articles (some of near monograph-length) are not in English, or are devoted to truly narrow and specialized topics. Yet Morford makes no mention of the ongoing series of proceedings of the Symposia Hellenistica (which began with Doubt and Dogmatism. ed. M. Schofield, M. Burnyeat, and J. Barnes [Oxford, 1980]; subsequent volumes have appeared at roughly three-year intervals), containing some of the very finest recent philosophical scholarship on Hellenistic philosophy. (If it is a mistake to treat Roman philosophy as the poor relation of Greek thought, it is also clear, and wholly uncontroversial, that in order to make progress in understanding the thinkers and writers from “the Roman world” whom Morford considers, one needs as thorough and as fine-grained a grasp of Hellenistic philosophy as possible.) Morford’s own “References” (269-77) are simply an unanalyzed list, unhelpfully divided into “Books” and “Articles and Book Chapters.” For a sense of how this sort of thing can be done right, one need look no further than A. A. Long’s splendid Epictetus: A Stoic and Socratic Guide to Life (Oxford, 2001): almost every chapter ends with a section entitled, “Further Reading and Notes”; there Long (in most cases) provides numerous recommendations together with fairly precise comments about how the different works mentioned are relevant to the specific topic of the chapter, or to some other, related, issue. (While Long focuses on a single thinker, he is decidedly not writing only for fellow scholars and historians of philosophy; indeed, his book could be used successfully in everything from an introductory survey-course on Greek philosophy to a graduate seminar on Stoicism.) And although Morford is correct in holding that the bibliographies from Barnes and Griffin are useful—N.B.: they do group the entries under many separate headings and sub-headings!—needing to track down those volumes for their bibliographies is inconvenient, and it undercuts the idea that Morford’s book is a self-contained survey of what he discusses. (Morford’s “References,” of course, include many important and interesting works; and if his book were a scholarly monograph, the fact that the bibliography is a mere list would be no problem at all. But in the case of a book that so clearly is introductory, it surely would be helpful if some guidance about the works listed were provided.)

I also have some serious reservations on (ii), that is, the need to be clear about what is generally accepted versus what is the subject of ongoing inquiry or, even, dispute. I will consider only two examples in detail. In c. 5, after some nice introductory remarks about the transition from the late Republic to the early Empire (131-35), Morford turns to three Augustan poets: Horace, Vergil, and Ovid. His discussion of Horace (136-46) is symptomatic (I believe) of how the desire for a simple and clear picture leads to over-simplification and confusion.

On the one hand, Morford tells us that “the Epicurean lathe biosas, ’live unobtrusively’ [= withdraw from public and, especially, political affairs—WM], is the most significant element in Horace’s philosophy of life” (138); and he quotes Epistles I, 18, 96-112, which Morford calls “fundamentally Epicurean” (140), as “distil[ling]” Horace’s “philosophy of life” (139), indeed, as “stand[ing] as his final statement of a philosophy of life” (140). Morford thus seems to be saying unequivocally that Horace was an Epicurean. On the other hand, from the opening of the Epistles, he quotes the lines (I, 1, 10-14) where Horace first announces his intention of giving up “poetry and other trifles,” in order to concentrate on “what is true and [morally] fitting”; Horace concludes by saying, “I don’t feel bound to swear allegiance to any master” (line 14), in other words, he is not going to be an orthodox follower of any of the established philosophical schools or movements. Morford elaborates on what he calls this “lack of rigidity” (138), by noting that Horace will sometimes maintain that he is as “austere” as any Stoic when it comes to refraining from sensual pleasures, but will at other times lapse into the hedonism of Aristippus (an associate of Socrates and the founder, or at any rate, the philosophical ’ancestor’ of the Cyrenaic school, which identified pleasure as the good). From that claim, Morford proceeds immediately to saying that “the middle way between Stoic rigidity and Epicurean pleasure has a long history” (ibid.)

Morford has done four things here. First, Horace’s statement that he follows no philosophical school exclusively is interpreted as meaning that he locates himself between the Stoics and the Epicureans. Secondly (and without any argument), Aristippus’s position on pleasure has been equated with that of Epicurus. Yet given Epicurus’s identification of pleasure with the absence of pain, more precisely, with freedom from disturbance (= ataraxia), it is not so clear that (Morford’s) Aristippus’s advocacy of the active pursuit of sensual pleasure really is Epicurean at all. These first two moves of Morford’s suggest that he (tacitly) adheres to an outmoded picture of Hellenistic philosophy, one on which it is (virtually) to be defined by a global, over-arching rivalry between Stoicism and Epicureanism (construed as extreme points of a sort, say, on a continuum of views about the value of pleasure), so that any potential alternative to them needs to be described as some sort of “middle way.” But the scholarship of the last hundred (especially, the last thirty) years has shown this picture to be fundamentally mistaken. It is probably unhelpful to see the period as wholly shaped by the rivalry between any two schools; but if one wants to insist on such a view, the long-standing debate between the Stoa and the (sceptical) Academy was far more important. And as recent studies of the late (= first century BC) Academy and its contemporary Stoic adversaries have shown, to suggest that some Stoics and some Academics were seeking a “middle way” between their movements’ extremes (as represented by, say, Zeno and Chrysippus for the Stoics, and Arcesilas and Carneades for the Academics) makes quite good sense. Such a middle way could very much look like a non-dogmatic approach to what, as it were, is best in each philosophical school. (For example: the kind of follower of the New Academy that Cicero describes himself as being could easily be described as attempting to do this sort of thing.) Given that Horace (claims to have) studied in the Academy (Epistles II, 2, 42-45; cited by Morford on p. 137), if one were seeking a purely philosophical motivation for his “lack of rigidity,” ascribing it to Academic influence might thus be tempting—I stress the ’if,’ because there are good reasons to doubt that this is the best way of approaching Horace.

Thirdly, I was left wondering what, in the last analysis, Morford means by saying that Horace is “fundamentally” an Epicurean. For Horace’s quip that he is “a pig from the herd of Epicurus” (Epistles I, 4, 16) is highly self-conscious and ironical, and hardly leads straightforwardly to the conclusion that he was an Epicurean; Morford’s own discussion, e.g., of Horace’s decidedly un-Epicurean attitude towards the prospect of his own death, already suggests that matters are more complicated; and finally, the lengthy passage from Epistles I, 18 which he quotes contains nothing that a Stoic—especially a ’moderate’ Stoic of the first century BC—need disagree with. (N.B.: For purposes of this discussion, I mean to take no stand on the question of whether Horace was, or was not, an Epicurean; my concern rather is that given how Morford has presented things, I fail to see why we should say that Horace is an Epicurean rather than someone who freely borrows from various philosophers, depending on his immediate purposes. Consider Epistles I, 1, 15: having just said [in the lines briefly considered above] that he will follow no master, Horace continues, “wherever the storm drags me, I put ashore, seeking shelter.” This statement, even if it, too, is deeply tinged with irony, surely suggests that Horace will avail himself of whatever philosophical resources he happens upon, but not aim, as it were, to ’build’ a ’shelter’ from the ground up; in other words, he will not construct, or seek out, a philosophical system. Oddly enough, Morford in effect concedes all this, when he turns to Vergil: “Like Horace, Virgil [sic] is too complex a thinker to be identified with any one school of thought” [147]. But now the claim that Horace is “fundamentally” an Epicurean sounds peculiar indeed.)

Fourthly and finally, while Horace clearly was familiar with a wide range of Greek philosophical thinking (though there is considerable debate about just how deep his knowledge really was) and while there are (obviously) a large number of passages in his work that can be read as expressing a Lebensphilosophie, to me it seems naive to suppose that we can unproblematically infer that such passages express Horace’s philosophy of life. Indeed, the famous tag, primum vivere deinde philosophari, while not by Horace himself, seems like a suitably Horatian summary of his rejection of (any overly technical or systematic) philosophy, no matter which school, or which philosopher, it comes from.

Finding myself puzzled by Morford’s presentation—my recollections of Horace are based on having read a number of the Odes in school quite some time ago—I had a look at two articles which, by their titles, held out the promise of being helpful: John Moles, “Poetry, Philosophy, Politics and Play: Epistles I,” in Traditions and contexts in the poetry of Horace, ed. T. Woodman and D. Feeney (Cambridge, 2002), pp. 141-57; and Niall Rudd, “Horace as a Moralist,” in Horace 2000: A Celebration, ed. N. Rudd (London, 1993), pp. 64-88. And helpful they indeed were. While Rudd and Moles come to rather different conclusions, they do not seek to downplay the complexities engendered by Horace’s adoption of so many different (philosophical and other) personae; above all, each of them pays more attention to the various uses Horace makes of Greek philosophy rather than trying, in a by now outmoded way, to identify him with this or that school. Moreover, as James Zetzel’s concise and elegant “Dreaming about Quirinus: Horace’s Satires and the development of Augustan poetry” (in Woodman and Feeney, pp. 38-52) reminds us, we need to read Horace against the background of Hellenistic poetry, in order to appreciate his highly nuanced appropriation of some, and rejection of other, of its conventions, devices, tropes, commonplaces, and so on: “What programmatic statements and stylistic parodies alike demonstrate is that Horace both sees his poetry as belonging to the Alexandrian tradition and was willing and able to distance himself from it by parody, criticism, and revision” (44). That reminder, mutatis mutandis, should also be kept in mind when we turn to Horace’s use of philosophy.

I have gone on at such length about Morford’s treatment of Horace, because I suspect that many of his readers—especially those coming to The Roman Philosophers with a background in philosophy—will not know anything about Horace, and would thus be open to an introduction to this undoubtedly fascinating figure. But reading Morford will either leave them thinking Horace was simply an Epicurean (yet wondering how that really could be so) or leave them confused. Articles like those by Rudd and Moles show that confusion need not be the inevitable result of trying to take seriously the role of philosophy in Horace’s poetry; and it is easy to imagine discussions along the lines they offer—presented in a somewhat simpler and briefer form, with all the texts translated, and so on—being more useful than Morford’s, even, and especially, for those readers approaching all this for the first time.

Similar (or related) concerns could be raised about many more parts of Morford’s book. I will take up only one. His discussion of Lucretius is heavily indebted to David Sedley’s important Lucretius and the Transformation of Greek Wisdom (Cambridge, 1998). (As a matter of fact, anyone interested in Lucretius, or Epicurus, or the—originally Greek—tradition of presenting philosophy in hexameter verse should turn directly to this book. Sedley, of course, is looking at Lucretius in relation to Greek philosophy; but he also provides a fascinating analysis of those passages where Lucretius expressly seeks to forge a new, Latin vocabulary, and those where he relies on Graecisms, offering a novel and subtle take on what is Greek, and what is Roman, for Lucretius.) But Morford’s claim that “the poem of Lucretius is the most powerful work in all of Roman philosophy” (98) is unhelpful hyperbole; what of Augustine’s writings? Moreover, if true, it serves to call into question the very idea of Roman philosophy (see also below), since, as Sedley has argued and as Morford agrees, Lucretius uses (parts of) Epicurus’s On Nature as his sole philosophical source (i.e., he is not relying on other writings of Epicurus himself, or on ones by contemporary Epicureans; nor is he attacking contemporary Stoics or Academics). Here one might be tempted to ask, if this “most powerful” work of Roman philosophy is derivative, what are we to say about the other, less powerful ones?

Now, in c. 1, Morford had expressly denied that Lucretius is “derivative”; indeed, he had there called him “the first truly original Roman philosopher” (5), despite the fact that he aims to present the thought of Epicurus. Why? “[T]he exposition of Epicurean doctrine in Latin hexameter verse called for an original genius, who created a new language, appropriate for the dignity of epic verse, that expounded Epicurus’ teaching with power and intensity” (5-6). Fair enough, in fact, spot on, but scarcely a basis for calling Lucretius an original philosopher.

A little more than two thousand years after Lucretius, Mary Poppins (= Julie Andrews) sings, “Just a spoonful of sugar will make the medicine go down/ In the most delightful way.” In the proem to Book IV (= lines 1-25), Lucretius makes clear that this is his project as well—to offer “in sweet Pierian song,” coated “with the honey of the Muses” (21-22), the perhaps overly austere teaching of Epicurus, so that he, Lucretius, can fix your mind (officially: that of Memmius, the addressee of the work; but in reality: that of each and every reader) on the true (Epicurean) account, so that you can “grasp the whole nature of things and perceive its value” (25). In short, then, Lucretius’s originality is poetic, taking an obscure and difficult subject—Epicurean natural philosophy—and presenting it, clothed in hexameter verse, in a highly artful and appealing way. (However, here, too, there are important precedents in Hellenistic poetry for dealing poetically with technical and, one might say, intrinsically unpoetic subjects—think of, say, Aratus’s Phainomena, a work Cicero undertakes to translate into Latin.)

Morford seems so intent on counteracting (what he sees as) the neglect of Roman contributions to philosophy that he indulges in overstatement of a sort which (I believe) is especially misleading in an introductory work, aimed at non-experts. In addition and of perhaps still greater concern, there is this. What Morford has to say about the actual details of (Lucretius’s) Epicureanism is not especially helpful either. The reader who has not previously encountered an ancient atomic theory of nature (whether Democritus’s or Epicurus’s) will be confounded. (Morford’s account, on pp. 100-102, of the relation between Lucretius’s De Rerum Natura and Epicurus’s On Nature, is too short to be helpful, but long enough to interrupt the flow of his presentation. In any event, it does nothing to explain either the content of the atomism or the philosophical motivation for it.) And while Morford may well be right that Lucretius’s interest is, ultimately, in the ethical implications of Epicurus’s thought, the fact remains that, on the face of it, De Rerum Natura is not so focused on these aspects of Epicureanism (excepting the beautiful discussion of the fear of death, in III, 830-1094), a fact incidentally corroborated by Morford’s turn to Epicurus’s Letters for the ethics. But if we have accepted Sedley’s arguments (as Morford says he has), why we should look at those letters for insights into Lucretius?

It seems to me that Lucretius is in fact very effective at presenting both the (meta)physical theory and its ethical implications. Like all Greek philosophers since Parmenides, Epicurus—and thus Lucretius too—accepts a version of the following conservation principles: at the most fundamental level of reality, nothing comes to be from nothing (De Rerum Natura I, 150 ff.); and no thing, when it ceases to be, disintegrates into nothing (I, 215 ff.). At the level of experience, of course, it does (sometimes) seem that things come to be from nothing, or that they disintegrate into nothing. We therefore need an account of how the level of experience depends on, and is linked to, the fundamental level in such a way that what appears to be happening at the level of experience proves compatible with how things are at the fundamental level. Atomism is an attempt at such an account: the atoms themselves, which are too small to be observed directly, and the void, are not subject to generation or destruction (nor indeed to change of any sort, except, in the case of the atoms, change of place—the void itself is simply changeless). And the generation and destruction to which the objects of experience seem to be subject, are to be explained in terms of changing combinations and recombinations of the (intrinsically unchanging) atoms. (Lucretius spends the bulk of Books I and II expounding the atomic theory.) Thus the metaphysical task of linking fundamental (Parmenidean) reality with reality as it is experienced by us has been accomplished.

But there remains the epistemological problem of justifying the choice of atomism rather than one of its competitors. Here Lucretius does a very good job indeed. On the basis of a number of thought-experiments and quasi-empirical observations, he concludes that atomism provides what is, in effect, the best explanation of the observed phenomena. But now the link to Epicureanism’s ethical implications also becomes clear. How?

Lucretius suggests that anomalies at the level of experience (e.g., a perfectly healthy person suddenly becomes ill and then dies) led people to suppose that something at a deeper, unobserved level must have been happening to account for those anomalies (e.g., a God was angry with the person for having done, or failed to do, such-and-such). But supposing that the Gods behave this way leads to anxiety and unhappiness, since the world of experience does not prove systematically intelligible in its own terms and we thus are forced to view the underlying workings of the Gods as being inscrutable. In other words: we can never know what the Gods really want, thus never really be sure whether we are pleasing or angering them, and so also can have no confidence in a blessed (rather than a torment-filled) afterlife. Yet if we recognize the truth of Epicureanism, we will see, first, that the underlying level of reality (= atoms and the void) is much more systematic and ordered than we might have thought; secondly, that genuinely unintelligible events are so due to an intrinsic randomness inherent in (some of) the atomic motions, and not to the inscrutable verdicts of capricious Gods; and thirdly, that there is no afterlife, since we, too, are combinations of atoms: thus when the particular combination that is, for example, me, is dissolved, then, although the atoms of course do remain (and are ready to enter into other compounds), there is nothing remaining that is me, and therefore also nothing that could be the subject of my afterlife, properly so called. Moreover, fourthly, rational reflection on the very idea of divinity makes clear that it would be incompatible with the nature of genuine Gods for them to be concerned about, much less to meddle in, human affairs in the ways in which traditional religious thought (and folk superstition) supposes. Thus a rational understanding of nature and its workings (and of our human place within nature) makes possible a life free from disturbance, at least free from the disturbance which comes from having the various false views most of us, under the influence of tradition and superstition, as a matter of fact do have.

This sketch of Lucretius’s Epicureanism would obviously need to be elaborated and qualified in various ways; and it could, no doubt, be challenged on some points. Nonetheless, it clearly is possible to present what Lucretius is doing in a largely self-contained way, (more or less) along the lines suggested. I would have thought that in a work devoted to Roman philosophy, this would be the natural approach to take.

On a more positive note: one matter which does stand out as particularly valuable is Morford’s discussion of Musonius Rufus, the teacher of Epictetus (203-208). Musonius’s historical importance is undeniable; including him in a book of this sort is thus welcome, especially since even the scholarly literature on him is sparse. (However, C. Lutz’s “Musonius Rufus: ’The Roman Socrates’,” Yale Classical Studies 10 [1947], pp. 3-147—not mentioned by Morford—remains fundamental: after a succinct introduction, she includes a collection of fragments and testimonia, along with translations.) Biographical details about Cicero and Seneca are easier to come by; still, having a brief version of them assembled here (in Chapters 3 and 6, respectively) is helpful. (Nonetheless, readers will also want to turn to three works absent from Morford’s “References”: M. Griffin’s “Philosophy for Statesmen: Cicero and Seneca,” in Antikes Denken—Moderne Schule, ed. H. W. Schmidt and P. Wülfing [Heidelberg, 1987] [= Gymnasium, Beiheft 9], pp. 133-150; and B. Inwood’s exceptional “Seneca and his Philosophical Milieu,” as well as G. Striker’s beautifully concise “Cicero and Greek Philosophy,” both in Harvard Studies in Classical Philology 97 [1995], pp. 63-76 and 53-61, respectively.) And more generally, the comments Morford makes about extra-literary and extra-philosophical historical events, while simple and basic, provide a kind of context often missing from more overtly philosophical histories of philosophy. Finally, the translations Morford provides are accurate and readable; and he (rightly) supplements the translated passages with a large number of references to the relevant primary texts. Thus his readers are in the position of being able, with only a minimum of effort, to look up for themselves what the authors discussed were saying. On all these points, Morford’s book is indeed recommendable.

Lastly, I would like to turn a larger and, as it were, more theoretical question, namely, what might be meant by “Roman philosophy”? Morford’s official statement is the following: “after Cicero we can for the first time define a Roman philosopher as a Roman student of Greek philosophy, who has adapted Greek doctrines for the needs of Roman society and politics, with a prevailing focus on ethics” (5). But he also says that “Epictetus is included as a Roman philosopher because of his Roman citizenship (he became a citizen on being freed from slavery), his years of residence in Rome, and the direct relevance of his doctrines to Roman life” (10). (Recall that although Epictetus at one point countenances the possibility of explaining Chrysippus in Latin [Diss. I. 17. 16], he was himself a Greek; that his Discourses, written down by Arrian, are in Greek; that the exempla from mythology he employs are Greek; and that he quotes or alludes to Greek philosophical predecessors.) On the other hand, according to Morford, Plutarch

is definitely not a Roman philosopher, and he himself boasts of his loyalty to his home town (Chaeronea) and admits that he did not learn Latin thoroughly. He was a Roman citizen, highly honoured by the emperor Hadrian and the friend of many prominent Romans. His enormous output makes it impossible to leave him out of any consideration of philosophical developments in the second century CE. His views on Roman character and leadership, seen in his Roman Lives, and his criticisms of Stoic and Epicurean doctrines in the Moralia, are important in any assessment of Roman philosophy. (Ibid.)

I can see no reason why Epictetus does, but Plutarch “definitely” does not, count as a Roman philosopher; and matters are not helped by being told that, for all that, Plutarch will nonetheless be discussed. If we recall that at the very beginning of his book, in the Preface, in a sentence quoted above, Morford had spoken of the “writings and ideas of the principal philosophers in the Roman world” (between 155 BC and AD 180) (see p. ix), it would seem that Plutarch, and many others as well, should, on this more generous conception of Roman philosophy, count as Roman philosophers. Equally strange: Arius Didymus, the author of an important summary of ethics (preserved by Stobaeus), gets mentioned (134-36), it appears, because he was “a friend and adviser” of Augustus (135); but Thrasyllus, whom tradition associates with the tetralogical order of Plato’s dialogues—the order which was to prevail for centuries—and who for a time was the court-philosopher and court-astrologer of Tiberius, makes no appearance in the The Roman Philosophers. Morford adds to my puzzlement by relying on Diogenes Laertius at various points but excluding any real references to Galen or Sextus Empiricus (whose reports and criticisms are at least as important as those of Plutarch). Moreover, Morford’s chronological stopping-point (AD 180) seems peculiarly arbitrary, since Augustine (AD 354-430) and Boethius (ca. AD 480-524)—for a time, a Roman senator!—surely were Roman philosophers (as Morford happily grants, see pp. 12-13); indeed, they were ones who wrote in Latin.

This unclarity about what Roman philosophy is supposed to be, it seems to me, results from failing to distinguish clearly (at least) three different enterprises or subject-matters.

1) The reception of Greek philosophy by educated Romans. An illuminating inquiry into this Rezeptionsgeschichte would need also to compare the reception of other technical disciplines (e.g., medicine or astronomy) with the one accorded to philosophy. Here we would be dealing not so much with anything that should be labeled “Roman philosophy” per se, as with the impact of (Greek) philosophy on Roman intellectual and cultural life, and, perhaps, thereby also on Roman (political and social) institutions.

2) The attempts by some educated Romans, e.g., Lucretius, Cicero, and Seneca, both literally to translate Greek philosophical writings into Latin, but also, and more importantly, to create (as Morford says) a new Latin vocabulary so that philosophical questions could be formulated and addressed in Latin. (For some important differences in the character of the Latin terminology introduced by Lucretius and, especially, Cicero, on the one hand, and by Seneca, on the other, see Inwood’s “Seneca in his Philosophical Milieu.”) Here, too, it would be illuminating to look at the attempts made in (and for) other disciplines, enabling them to carry on discussion of their central topics in Latin. Looked at this way, Roman philosophy would turn out to be philosophy done in Latin. While such a restricted focus is undoubtedly important if we are primarily interested in developments within literary Latin, there is no reason to expect that there will be any philosophically important divide between those who write in Latin and those who continue using Greek. More cautiously: one would like to see some evidence that such a divide is philosophically important. (On the whole matter of Latin as a language for philosophy, see the collection: La Langue latine, langue de la philosophie: Actes du colloque organisé par l’École Française de Rome, ed. P. Grimal [Rome, 1992].)

Two potentially very interesting comparison cases would be rhetoric and grammar. To what extent do Roman technical writings in these disciplines accommodate features of the Latin language, as opposed to seeking to impose essentially Greek categories onto Latin? And, in the case of rhetoric, to what extent do Roman rhetorical works recognize the quite different political realities of Rome—whether Republican or Imperial—as compared to those of the Greek city-states, especially Athens, of the fifth and fourth centuries BC? And if they do recognize such differences, do they do so in ways that makes it appropriate to speak of a distinctively Roman art of rhetoric?

(In addition, there is this. Over the course of the last thirty or so years, historians and linguists have produced a rather large body of important work on the interrelated topics of: literacy in antiquity; bilingualism, especially, that involving Latin and Greek; and the use of particular languages as ways of expressing national or cultural identity. Some of their results may well prove of interest and direct relevance to historians of philosophy. To see why, consider only one example: Cicero seems, in his correspondence, to adjust the amount of Greek he quotes, and the number of Graecisms he uses, depending on whom, exactly, he is writing to. I believe that it would be well worth investigating if there is, say, quite generally a greater reliance on Greek, or, more to the point, on Graecisms within Latin, in philosophical writing as opposed to writing in other specialized fields, such as, again, grammar or rhetoric, on the one hand, or medicine, astronomy, or mathematics, on the other. Morford, unfortunately, takes no steps at all in the direction of considering matters of this sort, which is a pity, given the newly favorable context that the recent scholarship from ancient history, historical linguistics, and sociolinguistics has created for inquiry into precisely these kinds of issues.)

3) One could also investigate the impact of Roman expansion and, later, the existence of the Empire and its institutions, on both the practice and the content of philosophy. Thus we might now label as “Roman philosophers” either those who identify with the Empire (or are reacting against it) or those who are, somehow, influenced by it in other ways. Yet proceeding this way involves stepping onto slippery ground indeed: there are philosophers, e.g., Plotinus, whom no-one would want to call Roman philosophers, who, however, do certain things, e.g., move to the city of Rome, precisely because of the status of Rome as the capitol of the Empire, the presence there of other intellectuals, and so on. Moreover, from a certain point onwards, all of ancient philosophy is done “in the Roman world.” Should it all therefore be thought of as Roman philosophy? Here it seems telling that P. A. Brunt, in one of the true gems of historical and philosophical scholarship, his “Stoicism and the Principate” (Papers of the British School in Rome, 43 [1975], pp. 7-35)—not mentioned by Morford in his “References,” although he must surely know it—is able to enhance enormously our understanding of the philosophers’ (principally, the Stoics’) thinking about the Empire, and of the emperors’ attitudes towards philosophers, without, so far as I can see, ever using the expression, “Roman philosophy.”

Calling into question the label, “Roman philosophy,” is in no way meant to call into question a central part of Morford’s underlying claim: that the figures he considers deserve the full attention of those aiming to understand the philosophy of antiquity. Their neglect (though it is not quite as severe as Morford makes it out to be) is due to a variety of factors, not least of which are: the excessive valorization of ancient Greece in nineteenth century Germany and Britain (and the concomitant desire to see everything Roman as merely derivative); the frequent reluctance by historians of philosophy to study closely authors who are not obviously, or who obviously are not, philosophers; and the unwillingness of all too many historians of literature to countenance the possibility that a writer who is not a philosopher, e.g., a poet, might be taking philosophy seriously. It is something of an irony, then, that in using the expression, “Roman philosophy,” in the ways in which he does, and thus running together the three subject-matters briefly mentioned above, Morford shows himself to be, tacitly, following the very sort of tradition he is seeking to overcome. For what unites the figures he includes under this heading is nothing principled or systematic, only a convention—one whose source(s) it would in fact be worth getting clear about—of including them (but not others) in treatments of Roman philosophy, or philosophy done in Rome. As our understanding of philosophical activity during the late Hellenistic period and during the first several centuries of the Empire increases and deepens, we need to ask whether continued adherence to that convention will help us make further progress, not take for granted that it will do so.

Now someone might object that it is churlish to complain about the lack of such methodological explicitness and self-consciousness in an avowedly introductory book. I could not disagree more strongly. It is especially in such works that clarity on these kinds of matters is needed. It would have been far preferable if Morford, after having acknowledged the absence of a systematic, theoretically grounded conception of Roman philosophy, had said something like this: any treatment of anything we might call “Roman philosophy”—or, at least, any treatment of Roman philosophical writing—must include discussions of, for example, Lucretius, Cicero, and Seneca; but to understand these writers, one must also know something about certain other figures; moreover, while perhaps not, strictly speaking, necessary for understanding either the principal or the secondary figures, there are still other texts (or other sorts of historical detail), knowledge of which can enhance, say, our appreciation of the accomplishments of those in whom we are most interested; thus some discussion of these further texts (or further points of detail) is also desirable. Such a procedure would, no doubt, have something of an ad hoc flavor; but if presented clearly, it would let readers know of the author’s sense of his or her subject. As Morford’s book stands, one is confronted with the frustrating task of trying to figure out what basis he relied on in selecting those figures to be included, and those to be excluded. Finding no such basis, the inexperienced reader (or student in an introductory course) might reasonably enough conclude: well, this just is what Roman philosophy is. But, as I have been suggesting, matters are not so simple: caveat lector.