The Roman Stoics: Self, Responsibility, and Affection

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Gretchen Reydams-Schils, The Roman Stoics: Self, Responsibility, and Affection, Chicago University Press, 2005, 210pp., $26.00 (pbk), ISBN 0226710262.

Reviewed by Charles Brittain, Cornell University


The Roman Stoics presents an ambitious analysis of the 'social embeddedness' of Stoic ethics in the work of a group of late Stoic thinkers. The study is framed as an interpretation of the role of 'the Roman Stoic self' as a mediator between traditional social practices and normative ideals (p. 52) -- viz. as an examination of the interaction between Stoic philosophical theory and social life in the works of Stoic moralists. But it also has a larger, if sometimes less explicit, philosophical ambition, which is to argue that the Roman Stoic contribution to Stoic psychology and ethics resulted in a significant 'upgrading' of the value of social relationships (p. 81). While it is not clear that Reydams-Schils is entirely successful in establishing the second claim, the book is a valuable addition to the recent revival of serious philosophical work on the later Stoics.

The book is structured around the notion of the mediating self. The introduction defines the 'Roman Stoics' as a specific group of post-Hellenistic writers who share -- in some of their work, at any rate -- a common methodology, consisting in a stress on 'the care of the self' and 'social responsibility'. (The primary list covers works by Cicero [with qualifications], Seneca, Musonius, Epictetus, Hierocles, and Marcus Aurelius, i.e. texts from the period 45 BC to 180 AD.) Reydams-Schils suggests that the combination of these features yields a notion of the mediating self capable of explaining some vital aspects of Roman Stoic ethics and defending its proponents against charges of social conformity or social withdrawal. Chapter 1 sets out a 'working definition' of the Roman Stoic self as an individual rational consciousness, embedded in physical and social realities, and mediating in an inner realm between ideal and ordinary practices. Chapter 2 contextualizes that self within the social realm through an analysis of the application of Stoic theories of value and appropriate action (or 'duty') to our relations with other people, and of the alterations to these theories by the Roman Stoics. And chapters 3-5 then examine the role of this social self as a mediator between ideal and ordinary practices in political life, parenting, and marriage, respectively.

The philosophical centre of the book is the analysis of the Roman Stoic self and its social relations in chapters 1-2. Chapter 1 suggests that the Stoic view of 'the core of a human being' (p.15) as a rational mind in a certain relation to its body, especially as modified by certain Roman Stoic preoccupations, should be seen as a theory of the 'self'. The argument seems to work in two stages: the first argues that the Stoic unitary model of the mind's capacities for cognition and impulse, together with their theory of individual differentiation between rational minds and their materialism, allows us to identify a new and robust conception of 'self'. The second stage supplements the generic Stoic model of the mind with some specifically Roman Stoic traits, including a new stress on interiority, self-control, 'reservation', and (non-metaphysical) mind-body dualism, as well as an existential identity based on memory and a re-evaluation of temporality.

The presentation makes this argument rather hard to assess at two points. First, it is not clear how much hangs on the Stoics having a new and robust conception of the 'self', or what the criteria for robustness are. Here, as elsewhere in the book, the Stoic view is introduced by comparison with a rather reductive Platonic model, in this case of the mind as divided between non-rational and rational faculties, and reason, its core, regarded as an impersonal and essentially transcendental faculty. Even if the weak characterization of the Platonic view is conceded, Reydams-Schils does not explain why a Stoic unitary model of cognition and impulse should favour a mediating self: one might instead think that reason's struggle to moderate and control non-rational desire in Republic 8-9 is a prime case of internal mediation, and one that can be replicated to greater or lesser degrees in the social world. Secondly, it is uncertain to what extent Reydams-Schils credits the Roman Stoics specifically with the formation of the new conception. It is clear that these writers have a special interest in 'interiority'. But the traits of self-control and reservation seem already present in Chrysippus, especially in his well-attested work on the treatment of emotion; and a strong mind-body dualism is plausibly ascribed to Cicero's likely Greek 'middle Stoic' sources (see ND 3.22, responding to 2.45, & Div. 1.64). A sceptical reader might also question whether a new conception of existential identity can be founded on Seneca's remark that "I am the same who was the infant, the child, the youth and the old man" (Ep. 121.16) and a group of passages stressing memory of past goods (pp. 32-3). Seneca doesn't mention memory as a criterion for personal identity in this letter; and the supporting passages are capped by a 'middle Stoic' citation that alludes to the standard 'old Stoic' definition of memory as the 'storehouse of impressions' (cf. Sextus M. 7.373 & Cicero Ac. 2.22).

Still, Reydams-Schils's argument doesn't depend on the originality of this set of views in later Stoicism, but on their concatenation and pervasiveness in Roman Stoic texts. If it remains unclear whether this amounts to a particularly robust or new conception of the self, the first chapter nevertheless succeeds in giving a useful sketch of the phenomena that she calls 'the embedded self'.

Chapter 2 turns to the social aspects of this self. The basic problem Reydams-Schils tackles here is a familiar one: since the Stoics hold that only virtue and its direct concomitants are good, they don't seem to leave any space for valuing our ordinary social attachments, such as those to our cities or states, our spouses, our children or our friends, given that these are not in fact good. Chapter 2 develops the Stoic response to this problem on two (inter-mixed) levels. The first sketches the standard 'old Stoic' solution in two main stages. First, the exercise of virtue consists in performing appropriate actions, and the latter are constituted by selections of actions that accord with our nature, but are per se indifferent to our happiness. Since the theory of appropriation (oikeiosis) shows that our natural inclinations include social attachments, appropriate actions will include social engagements, such as participating in political life, marrying, taking care of one's children etc. Secondly, although most of our social engagements are technically 'indifferent' in this sense, and hence overridable in special circumstances, some of them -- our commitment to friends, assuming that they are virtuous, and to the universal community of rational beings -- are in fact partly constitutive of perfect reason or virtue, and hence genuine goods. Reydams-Schils perhaps underestimates some of the difficulties involved in giving a satisfying reconstruction of this old Stoic theory (on which see Tad Brennan's The Stoic Life [Oxford 2005] Part III). But this is because her focus is on the affective attitudes it allows for. As she rightly stresses, it does not follow from the fact that we should treat e.g. our children as negligible in some special circumstances that we are not supposed to have an intense concern for them in most situations.

But the central contention in this chapter is the second level response, i.e. Reydams-Schils's claim that the Roman Stoics introduced a significant set of changes to this aspect of old Stoic ethics, one that amounted to an overall upgrade of social relations (pp. 60-9 & 81-2). The theoretical evidence she adduces for this thesis depends on three points: (1) a change in the status of social objects -- such as parents, children, moderate resources and social recognition -- from being merely indifferents with 'productive' selective value, like money, to 'preferred' indifferents with 'intrinsic' selective value, like quick-wittedness (pp. 60-2, citing Stobaeus Ec. 2.7.b, p.80 W & Cicero Fin. 3.57). (2) a new privileging of social duties as peculiarly rational actions (p. 63, citing D.L. 7.108-9 & Cicero Off. 1.153). And (3) a new stress on the doctrine of 'reservation' -- that is, of qualified impulses -- which is now aimed primarily at social responsibility (pp. 63-4, cf. 28-9 & esp.108-10, citing Marcus 11.37 = Epictetus F27). The idea is that once we have seen how these theoretical changes amount to a radical upgrading of social relations, we can make sense of a wealth of evidence in the Roman Stoics.

It is debatable, however, whether the evidence adduced by Reydams-Schils is sufficient to support this strong conclusion. Point (1) seems to rest on a questionable reading of the scope of Stobaeus' distinction between 'intrinsic' and 'productive' indifferents, bolstered by a genuine dispute over the selective value of social recognition. Stobaeus does list social recognition as a 'preferred indifferent'; but so had Chrysippus (see DL 7.102, a passage that precedes Diogenes' non-Zenonian analysis of preferred indifferents as anything with positive selective value). But Stobaeus nowhere says that any of the social goods he lists are 'intrinsic' as opposed to 'productive' indifferents -- he merely notes that preferred indifferents in general fall under at least one of those categories. And the fact that Antipater or some of Chrysippus' and Diogenes' successors switched social recognition from the productive to the intrinsic category merely shows that there was a dispute about that question. The passages thus give us no positive reason to think that Chrysippus and Antipater disagreed about the kind of selective value children or parents should have for us. Point (2) looks dubious with respect to Diogenes, since 7.108-9 seems to give a general characterization of appropriate actions -- as what reason calls on us to do -- and some social examples which are followed in the next paragraph by some non-social examples. And while Cicero does privilege duties derived from justice in De officiis 1.152-8 (if not as peculiarly rational actions), this final section of the book is explicitly his own work, i.e. not derived from Panaetius (cf. 1.152), and thus not direct evidence for a Stoic view. Point (3) relies on a similar inference from several social examples of 'reservation' to what looks like an unfounded conclusion about its scope. The full text of Marcus 11.37, like the case in 5.20, makes it clear that Marcus and Epictetus meant this exhortation to cover all impulses, i.e. all actions -- as Epictetus says plainly in Ench. 2.

Although similar caveats might be applied to the less theoretical evidence Reydams-Schils cites, it is perhaps more useful to suggest the strange implications her view seems to have. The Roman Stoics should think that social duties are vital because justice is one of the four cardinal virtues in the Stoa. They should also think that action in general should be attentive to the requirements of the community (as e.g. Marcus 11.37 says it should be) because the virtues share common 'theorems' in the Stoic theory codified by Chrysippus. But what seems strange about the Roman Stoic theory as Reydams-Schils presents it is the implication that social duties require that one regard concern for one's own health, safety or sanity as, in general, less rationally warranted -- or less privileged, or less a subject for 'reservation' -- than concern for other people's. This seems particularly strange in Reydams-Schils's Stoics, whose concerns are locally embedded rather than the abstract dictates of an impersonal 'morality'. Stoic rationality does not require the undervaluation of one's own interests. The difficulty for the Stoics is not to decide whether to privilege justice over prudence -- despite Carneades' sceptical argument to that effect -- but rather how to adjudicate between merely apparent cases of conflict between these values.

It is important to note, however, that these reservations about the theoretical novelty of the Roman Stoic view do not undermine what I take to be the main achievement of this book, viz. its elucidation of the largely underrated significance of social attachments to Stoics of all sorts. As Reydams-Schils makes clear in chapters 3-5, the Roman Stoic texts manifest a deep concern with the integration of ordinary activities and relations -- such as political participation, parenting and marriage -- into the framework of a philosophical life.

I can address, however, only two general issues raised by the wealth of material Reydams-Schils has brought together. The first concerns the kind of innovation that we find in these texts, for instance, on the issue of marriage, the strongest candidate for a major shift in the Stoic tradition. In Chapter 5 we learn that some later Stoics -- the evidence starts with Antipater in the 2nd C. BC -- promoted marriage as perhaps the most important social 'duty' in our lives, and construed it as a 'union of souls'. This, and especially the latter feature of it, looks at first like a radically new theme in the Stoic tradition. But it is unclear how we should interpret this appearance, for two reasons. First, as Reydams-Schils allows (pp. 145-6), the evidence for the old Stoic view on marriage is too slight, and too contradictory, to allow any certainty that the later texts are radically innovative. Hence she wisely eschews a general (and inevitably controversial) interpretation of Chrysippus or Zeno's views -- and in particular, of the way in which each of them reconciled Zeno's 'cosmopolitan' or ideal views on marriage in his Republic with their active promotion of it in ordinary society (DL 7.121, Jerome Ad Jovin. 2.48). Secondly, as she stresses, the later Hellenistic and Roman Stoics who advocate marriage, do so by interpreting it as (ideally) a form of friendship, i.e. by subsuming it under a recognized old Stoic social virtue. So if there has been a change, it is perhaps best seen as a response to a general shift in mores, in both Greek and Roman societies, rather than a reflection of a significant change in Stoic ethical theory.

If Reydams-Schils avoids a determinate answer to this problem, however, it is because the second part of the book frames the discussion in terms of her general theory of the 'mediating Roman Stoic self'. The idea in these chapters is to explain the Roman Stoic treatment of our engagement with ordinary life in terms of various kinds of mediation: between the individual and society (or detachment and political involvement) in chapter 3, and between the normative framework of Stoic ethics and the ordinary societal practices of parenting and marriage in chapters 4 and 5. The development of this idea raises two questions, one about the forms of mediation involved, and the second about the connexion between the relevant forms of mediation and the specifically Roman Stoic theory of the self in chapter 1.

The primary task of mediation in these chapters is to find a way of Stoicizing a range of social practices without demanding a futile challenge to the social fabric as a whole. On this line, the Roman Stoic is exhorted e.g. to choose a spouse with reference to their ethical potential rather than their social status, or to breast-feed her children rather than employing a wet-nurse. Reydams-Schils makes a strong case that this form of mediation is a practical way to promote Stoic ethical views, and one that is easily defensible against charges of conformism. But it is not clear that mediation of this kind depends on a particular theory of the self, since we can find other moralists of the same and later periods advocating similar -- in the case of Christian moralists --, and sometimes identical practices -- for instance, the Academic Favorinus on maternal breastfeeding (pp. 127-8). In the case of parenting in chapter 4, however, Reydams-Schils sometimes seems to construe mediation as a process of compromising between adherence to a consistent Stoic doctrine and the facts of human nature. At least, on the interpretation of Seneca's treatment of grief that she tentatively prefers, it looks like the Roman Stoic is committed to the view that although death is not bad, it is appropriate to have an emotional response to it, i.e. to believe that something bad has happened (see pp. 134-41). This is surprising, since she is open to an alternative interpretation that seems to offer an excellent case of mediation in a third sense, i.e. a use of Stoic psychological theory -- in this case, the theory of 'pre-emotions' -- to mitigate the apparently inhumane Stoic ban on grief at the death of one's child. (But I should avow my parti pris: the alternative interpretation is advocated by my former student Melanie Stowell.)

Still, though one may sometimes query the deployment of the notion of mediation, Reydams-Schils demonstrates its utility in a range of cases, perhaps most successfully in chapter 3, where she is able to show how the social theory of detached political involvement mirrors the psychological theory of reservation. Reydams-Schils has thus provided us with a significant exegetical tool for understanding the Roman Stoics, as well as a timely and provocative re-evaluation of the importance of social attachments in Stoic ethics.