The Romantic Absolute: Being and Knowing in Early German Romantic Philosophy, 1795-1804

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Dalia Nassar, The Romantic Absolute: Being and Knowing in Early German Romantic Philosophy, 1795-1804, University of Chicago Press, 2014, 341pp., $50.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226084060.

Reviewed by Judith Norman, Trinity University


Dalia Nassar's book is a welcome addition to the growing body of scholarly literature on the philosophy of German Romanticism. It is structured around three thinkers central to the movement, Novalis (Friedrich Leopold von Hardenberg), Friedrich von Schlegel, and Friedrich Wilhelm Joseph von Schelling. By examining some of the ideas these thinkers were exploring from about 1795 to 1802, Nassar constructs a distinctively philosophical position for romanticism during the fertile period of theory production between Kant and Hegel. The overarching theme of the book is the notion of the absolute: the role the absolute plays in each of these three men's system conceptions, and the philosophical problems that the notion of the absolute is brought in to address.

Nassar is sensitive to the problem of stipulating a unitary 'romantic' philosophical project, and therefore, after a brief, synthetic introduction, turns to her largely autonomous essays on each of the three romantic thinkers. Nor does she even try to construct any coherent and enduring system on behalf of each of these thinkers; rather, she looks at their patterns of philosophical commitment, the philosophical questions they are asking and the evolving ways in which they are trying to formulate systems that would address them. The distinctiveness she claims for her approach is to sidestep the scholarly controversy over whether the romantics were metaphysicians or epistemologists (by declaring them to be both), and to engage the scholarly controversy over whether they should be regarded as philosophers proper (which, she argues, they should) by demonstrating the interest of the philosophical positions to which they committed themselves, and by showing how their artistic endeavors should be regarded, at least in part, as responses to philosophically motivated problems.

She begins with Novalis, focusing largely though not exclusively on the notes he took while reading Fichte, Kant, and Hemsterhuis. Nassar's reading of these notes is nuanced and sophisticated, and she argues that Novalis gradually comes to develop a conception of being as relational. It is not a ground or first principle, but rather a mediation between mind and nature, self and other, the intelligible and sensible worlds. As such, it has both an epistemological and ontological (as well as moral) significance. Nor is it a static, timeless principle; it is a dynamic, developmental one, which presents itself to the investigator as a project to be realized rather than a dogma to be described. It is immanent to self and nature, and made manifest through the very process of knowledge, whereby nature is idealized (into thought) or through moral activity, in which supersensible motives are realized (in the world).

One of the great merits of this book is that it highlights the influence of Goethe on the development of romantic thought. Goethe was significant for Novalis, not so much as a poet, but more as a practicing scientist who viewed human creativity as of a piece with, and a continuation of, nature's own creative activity. Nassar demonstrates how these ideas suggest a systematic philosophical impulse on the part of Novalis, which can be described as an "empirical idealism" (in that it incorporates the work of practicing scientists), and which implies a criticism of (and is developed in response to) perceived flaws in Fichte's attempts to articulate a system of transcendental idealism. Fichte lacks a poetic impulse; he lacks any incorporation of the faculty of imagination and its realization of the creative force of nature into the service of a system of knowledge. Novalis will remedy this and further the aims of knowledge by showing nature as a work of art.

Nassar then turns to Schlegel. Drawing primarily upon his review of Jacobi's novel, Woldemar, as well as his 1800-01 lecture series, she develops a picture of Schlegel as an idealist philosopher. Like Novalis, Schlegel (on Nassar's reading) believes in a unity of being and knowing, and an immanent conception of the absolute. Schlegel does not believe in any dogmatic first principle or unconditioned ground, considering such a conception paradoxical (as unconditioned ground, such a thing would be in implicit relation to, and therefore conditioned by, the conditioned). Rather, like Novalis, he develops a relational conception of reciprocal conditioning, which is historical in nature and entails an original role for moral activity vis-à-vis nature: unlike Novalis, he sees human activity as imitating rather than furthering the activity of nature. Much of this has already been well explored in the scholarly literature on romanticism. But Nassar contributes to an understanding of the notion of reciprocal determination as an immanent ontological ground in which individuality and historicity are preserved rather than overcome.  Only a historical perspective (which implies the ontological category of becoming) can reconcile the finite and infinite. Nassar also shows how, for Schlegel, the relational notion of being prompts him to a novel theory of hermeneutics that locates cultural products in a specifically historical context. Furthermore, she argues that these philosophical commitments are, like those of Novalis, a conscious and sophisticated response to the problems of transcendental systems such as Fichte's -- Schlegel's historicism, for instance, arises in response to what he considers the incoherence of a timeless, unconditioned ground.

The final section is on Schelling, for whom it is not so much a matter of reconstructing philosophical credentials (those are already pretty clear) as establishing his proximity to romanticism. However, having argued for Novalis and Schlegel as idealist philosophers with similar commitments (both ontological and epistemological) to an anti-foundationalist, relational conception of the absolute, Nassar's implicit claim as to Schelling's romanticism is that his philosophy falls into a similar model. As with the previous thinkers, she highlights the influence of Goethe's nature philosophy, and in particular the role of his conception of metamorphosis in understanding the self-productivity of nature (extending the self-productivity previously thought unique to self-consciousness to nature as well).

Nassar provides a strong and interesting argument for the unity of Schelling's thought during this period (1795-1802), against the frequent scholarly accusation that Schelling keeps changing his mind. Rather, Nassar argues, Schelling had an abiding commitment to articulating a notion of the absolute, but an evolving sense of the philosophical problems this project involves and the philosophical tools it would require. This leads her to distance even Schelling's earlier thought from that of Fichte and show the abiding influence of Spinoza, especially in terms of Schelling's understanding of intellectual intuition as a mode of knowledge.

Particularly interesting is her account of the continuity of the System of Transcendental Idealism with the subsequent conception of an Identity philosophy. Although the System of Transcendental Idealism concluded with the poverty of reason (and an elevated role for aesthetic intuition and art, in presenting the absolute), Nassar argues that Schelling later comes to think that it is only transcendental philosophy that is unequal to the task.  Reason reconceived within a post-transcendental system is no longer taken to be a subjective faculty but a realization of subject-object indifference, and is accordingly in a position to supplant aesthetic intuition (now seen as -- or admitted to be -- inadequate) as a response to Fichte's complaints about the negativity of Schelling's absolute, and restoring philosophy to its rightful role as the highest science. Reason becomes the faculty of understanding the absolute in the particular, and of viewing natural products as archetypal, living unities of particular and universal (and thus more as natural processes than products).

Nassar has done a masterful and sophisticated job of reconstructing some of the primary philosophical positions of these three thinkers, paying careful attention to many nuances in the development of their ideas. What is less clear is the connection between these three studies, the ostensible unifying principle of the book. Of course it is hopeless to describe romanticism (if at all) other than as a kind of family resemblance between thinkers or texts. Were these three thinkers working with significantly similar conceptions of the absolute? The broad claim, that they all posited a common ground for both knowing and being, which was simultaneously epistemological and ontological, does not distinguish romanticism from other species of idealism at the beginning of the century. The more specific (and quite interesting) claim that this ground was conceived of in terms of relationality and mediation might serve to unite Novalis and Schlegel, as Nassar describes them (particularly if we admit her claim that "potentializing" can be read as a form of mediation). But it won't do as well for Schelling, unless identity is conceived as a relation, which might entail a problematic weakening of the conception of relationality. In any event, it is hard to derive a notion of romanticism from the set of resemblances Nassar presents that would block the unwelcome conclusion that Hegel, for instance, was a later romantic.

This is certainly not a family that Hegel himself would wish to belong to -- he famously dismisses the romantics as shoddy practitioners of literary theory. A great deal of recent scholarship, with which Nassar's project is aligned, aims to recuperate romanticism from Hegel's damning criticism by showing that the project of romanticism is an authentically philosophical one, sophisticated and novel (i.e., not simply an application of Fichtean transcendental idealism). One strategy in constructing this particular defensive argument is to subordinate the romantics' (or at least Novalis' and Schlegel's) literary products to their philosophical ones, to show that the literature was produced for philosophical aims, or aims that can be best articulated in philosophical terms. Nassar's question is merely, and somewhat narrowly, whether those philosophical terms are epistemological or ontological. (An important question, which Nassar does not address, might be whether, as sophisticated readers of Kant, the romantics would not have followed him in seriously problematizing this distinction altogether.)

There are of course other strategies for resisting Hegel's damning judgment, for instance by insisting that the romantics were in fact quite superior and highly interesting practitioners of literary theory. And although Nassar's book is an excellent reconstruction of the philosophies of romanticism, it has not entirely convinced me that Novalis and Schlegel ought to be seen primarily as philosophers. Although Schlegel and Novalis were highly prolific writers, neither in fact published a work of philosophy. It is clear that Schlegel, at least, has artistic reasons for being philosophical every bit as important (to him) as his philosophical reasons for being artistic; some of those reasons were explored quite thoroughly in The Literary Absolute, Philippe Lacoue-Labarthe and Jean-Luc Nancy's 1978 study of romanticism, and indeed of the concept of the absolute in romanticism. Despite the fact that Nassar's title calls this classic text almost irresistibly to mind, she does not really engage with their thesis except to indicate that Lacoue-Labarthe and Nancy believe that the project of romanticism was inaugurated by Kant's critical worries about our knowledge of the subject. I do not know that this is sufficient grounds for her resulting claim that this (and other literary critical readings of romanticism) should be seen as treating romantic concerns as epistemological. I think there could be a third category, of specifically literary critical concerns, and this is what Lacoue-Labarthe and Nancy call attention to with their claim that the absolute in romanticism should be viewed as literature. The approach involves paying greater attention to the question of literary form than Nassar does (although this question is certainly not absent from her analysis -- she gives a wonderful reading of Schlegel's novel, Lucinde, as a plant). But it holds out the promise that there is an alternative way of looking at romanticism's response to the challenge of Critical philosophy, different from a philosophical response but no less sophisticated or interesting. Regardless of whether the romantics wrote philosophy or literature, they certainly wrote texts, and thought (endlessly) about the question of textual production in perhaps unprecedentedly sophisticated and philosophically relevant terms.

Romanticism is a complex and many-faceted phenomenon, and our understanding of (and wonder at) this fascinating movement can only gain by the multiplicity of perspectives with which scholars have approached it. Nassar's book gives us one of the most interesting and insightful philosophical approaches I have read, and will no doubt be a landmark in the scholarship for some time to come.