The Roots of Bioethics: Health, Progress, Technology, Death

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Daniel Callahan, The Roots of Bioethics: Health, Progress, Technology, Death, Oxford University Press, 2012, 256pp., $55.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199931378.

Reviewed by Raanan Gillon, Imperial College, London


The breadth of Daniel Callahan's scholarly interests is superbly demonstrated in this selection of new and previously published essays -- as is his engaging and vigorous writing. The essays range over his areas of interest: ageing and death in the context of medical progress, allocation of scarce resources, and the 'juggernaut' of health care technology. They are, typically of their author, interesting, reflective and provocative. They also exhibit his self-acknowledged role as an 'autonomy basher'. The first two provide brief and delightful accounts of the establishment and story of the Hastings Center, founded by Callahan and psychiatrist Will Gaylin in 1969 as a 'non-partisan interdisciplinary research and educational organization devoted to ethics and the life sciences'; and of Callahan's own (highly successful) interdisciplinary career, in which he bemoans the lack of value accorded in the academy to the interdisciplinary in general, bioethics in particular. 'For me I have to confess the fun and adventure of the field comes in flitting about'- and in discoursing with a huge range of people from a huge range of disciplinary perspectives. And he indicates that he is far prouder of his range of publications in medical, health policy, law, social science and science journals and of his op-ed pieces in major American newspapers than of the only article he ever published in philosophy, his original academic field.

In his next essay, 'Minimalist Ethics', Callahan attacks a simplistically minimalist interpretation of Mill's harm principle that, he claims, has pervaded American society ('One may morally act in any way one chooses so far as one does not do harm to others' p. 38). But he also attacks Mill's own substantive claim -- made, Callahan points out, 'without offering any specific evidence' (p. 46) -- that 'mankind are greater gainers by suffering each other to live as seems good to themselves, than by compelling each to live as seems good to the rest' (p. 44). Against that claim Callahan offers his own counter claim (also, let it be said, 'without offering any specific evidence') that in contemporary American society the Millian minimalist ethic has produced

an intolerable level of moral nihilism and relativism as a cultural outcome. It is not and ought not to be just the Moral Majority that worries about violence and more-tolerant-than-thou sex on television; or about casual stealing, cheating, lying, and consenting-adult infidelity; or about rising assault and murder rates. Whatever the gain to liberty of the private standards and dispositions that tacitly support those developments, they all point to the emergence of an intolerable society, destructive as much to private as to public life. (p. 47)

Here, as elsewhere in this volume, Callahan's anger at his own society's moral minimalism and relativism flashes out. Is there an antidote to such minimalist ethics? Callahan is pessimistic: 

There are no new and better values on the moral horizon than those we already possess: liberty, justice, human dignity, charity, benevolence, and kindness and that is not a full list. A minimalist ethic cannot endure a serious attempt to deploy not just liberty and justice but all those values. Nor could it survive a new willingness to pass public judgment on conduct that the law may and should still permit. Civil tolerance is hardly tolerance at all if one moral choice is in principle as good as another. It can only make sense and show its full strength when there are standards against which to measure behaviour . . . We do not have to ban tawdry television programs, or publications, or obnoxious viewpoints. We just bring to bear all the private and public opinion we can against them. Will it work? It had better, for the next step will be far worse, and there are already many who would have the law do what ought to be the work of morality. (p. 49)

Callahan's next chapter continues his attack on 'minimalist ethics', this time in the guise of 'liberal individualism' in bioethics. Included in this attack is a dismissal of the four prima facie principles (respect for autonomy -- Callahan's particular bugbear -- beneficence, non-maleficence and justice) offered by Beauchamp and Childress as a basis for dealing with most of the moral problems in health care. Callahan considers 'principlism', as this approach is now called, to be in practice 'an expression of liberal individualism' (p. 59). He holds that although 'it still raises its head now and then, its numerous critics have taken much of the wind out of its sails'.

The recent publication of the seventh edition of the Beauchamp and Childress book suggests that principlism 'still raises its head' somewhat more than 'now and again'. Here I must state an interest as a physican (amongst physicians, Callahan remarks, principlism has been 'particularly popular . . . as a relatively clear and simple way of thinking through ethical problems ' (p. 59) ['hear, hear' says this one]). I also have an interest as a philosopher/bioethicist who has long adopted the 'four principles approach' as providing just those relatively clear and simple and -- most importantly -- universalisable, basic but prima facie moral standards 'against which to measure behaviour', the lack of which Callahan bemoans in his previous jeremiad chapter on 'minimalist ethics'.

Tellingly, Callahan seeks to 'convert' those four principles to 'communitarian principles'-- and all power to his aim. But in doing so he demonstrates their most important value: that these principles are similarly 'convertible' by all other particular moral theories and stances that purport to be based on common moral values, whilst remaining themselves a universalisable set of prima facie basic moral principles -- or moral standards -- that are common to and thus compatible with all those more specific moral stances, themselves often mutually incompatible. They thus can provide a basis for that broader common morality including, but not just, a communitarian one that eschews the simplistic individualistic moral minimalism (possibly made at least partly of straw?) that Callahan condemns (along with, let me venture, any other serious ethicist). They can also provide the moral standards against which virtues (and vices), understood as character traits, can be assessed, including those virtues listed by Callahan.

Callahan next identifies three broad sets of 'fundamental questions for bioethics' (p. 53): What are the proper goals and uses of medicine? What are realistic expectations for our health and what kind of research should we support to achieve it? What do we want to make of ourselves as human beings and what kinds of lives ought we to aspire to live? The remainder of his book addresses these questions, sometimes directly, sometimes indirectly.

In a doubtless too simple summary, his answers are: realistic expectations for our health should be 'adequate physical well-being (p. 74) during a full human life span in which we increasingly accept the inevitability of death (p. 81) -- a 'tame death' (p. 87) rather than the 'wild' death that results from contemporary 'medicine's de facto rejection at the research level of the ancient belief that death is inevitable' (p. 88) the nearer we get to the end of the normal age range, with explicit rejection of the notion that such acceptance of a natural life span is 'ageist' (p. 84). During that lifespan our well-being will be enhanced if we see ourselves as part of a community, concerned with the welfare and rights of the community as a whole and not merely with our own rights and welfare, and are ready to engage in public discussion about moral issues that many now consider to be private matters (chapter 4), rejecting 'minimalist' and simplistic ethical stances and accepting a range of traditional moral virtues including those mentioned above ('liberty, justice, human dignity, charity, benevolence and kindness, and that is not a full list' (p. 48)).

If these aims for a good life are accepted then the proper goals of medicine should be to help us attain and maintain that 'adequate' physical health (p. 74) that is necessary to achieve those aims, concentrating on 'helping the young become old' but not on 'an unrelenting war against death whatever a person's age and whatever the cost' (p. 150), remembering that 'we don't get out of this world alive' (p. 177) and in general avoiding an excessive concern about health and longevity that too easily turns into a 'tyranny of health' (p. 68). These goals for medicine and the uses of medicine are morally desirable in themselves. Accepting them would also help reduce the relentlessly increasing problem of escalating health care costs, both by reducing expenditure on medical efforts to prolong life when these efforts do not conform to these proper goals and uses of medicine; and by reducing expenditure on medical research. The latter expenditure is driven by unrealistic medical hopes of major benefit but also by highly realistic hopes of major commercial benefit especially for both the pharmaceutical and medical devices industries and the purveyors of health care, especially of course the doctors.

But Callahan doubts that his prescriptions -- especially those for accepting a full life span of, say, 80 years as normal and desirable for human beings and therefore reducing expensive high tech life prolonging interventions for the elderly (including, he is at pains to point out, himself) as they approach that normal life span -- will ever be accepted. Even if accepted in theory, he doubts that they will ever be politically implemented, especially not in the USA (p. 155).

In this relatively short review it would be impossible to do justice to these and the wide variety of other arguments that Callahan deploys in this absorbing collection as the essays range across death, dying, allowing to die and killing; the inevitable need to limit relentlessly increasing American expenditure both on health care itself and on (potential) health care research; the 'hype' concerning stem cells (especially embryonic stem cells); and the moral obligations of fatherhood (including, he argues, the moral obligations of anonymous sperm donors about which I will say a very little at the end). But in the rest of this review I shall focus on Callahan's discussion (chapter 5) of the World Health Organisation's famously implausible and potentially pernicious definition of health as 'a state of complete physical, mental and social well-being and not merely the absence of disease or infirmity'. I'll venture to disagree with Callahan's own earlier, admittedly tentative (and, I am very recently assured, no longer held!) account of health as, simply, 'a state of physical well-being' (p. 74).

Callahan points out that the WHO definition is potentially pernicious for, amongst other reasons, turning human well-being or flourishing into a medical issue and implicitly making the medical profession its gate keeper. Even more pernicious is its threat of turning all moral problems into health problems and correlatively its threat of what Callahan calls, in homage to Thomas Szasz, 'the tyranny of health' whereby 'Health is no longer an optional matter' but must be imposed upon us. However Callahan also points out that in support of the WHO account of health are both its discernment of 'the intimate connection between the good of the body and the good of the self, not only the individual self but the social community of selves.' (p. 73) and its reminder that even if health is not (pace WHO) sufficient for happiness, adequate health is a necessary condition for happiness (p. 74).

While agreeing with all that, Callahan's own tentative early remedial account of health as simply 'a state of physical well-being' (p. 74) is surely implausible. Although he is undoubtedly right that complete physical mental and social well-being is a near mythical concept that leaves health a virtually unattainable ideal, surely sufficient mental and social well-being, in addition to sufficient physical well-being, are necessary conditions of being healthy? Just as a combination of fever, vomiting and diarrhoea is unequivocally unhealthy, as he says, so too -- it seems obvious to this doctor -- equally and unequivocally unhealthy are the accompanying misery and wretchedness (impaired mental well-being) and the accompanying inability to participate socially.

The problem with the WHO definition is surely, as Callahan indicates, the word 'complete' and my own modification of the WHO definition of health would be to replace 'complete' with an explicitly evaluative and socially contextual 'adequate'. Thus health would be explicitly evaluatively defined as 'a state of adequate physical, mental and social well-being and not merely the absence of disease or infirmity'. Against Callahan's dismissal of mental well-being in the definition on the grounds that 'one can be healthy yet anxious, well yet depressed' I'd counter by saying that if one's mental well-being is sufficiently impaired (i.e., severely so) one is indeed unhealthy; one's mental well-being is inadequate for health. Yes, one can be healthy yet anxious; but if one is severely and especially persistently severely anxious -- if one has a severe anxiety state -- one is unhealthy both in common parlance as well as in medical parlance. Similarly while indeed one 'can be well yet depressed', if one is severely and persistently depressed one is neither well nor healthy, again as generally as well as medically understood. As for social well-being, as Callahan says, 'that brat next door' may not be 'sick' if he is not 'running a fever'. On the other hand, if his antisocial behaviour is severe and persistent then while he may not be 'sick' (except in a parasitically metaphorical sense) he can quite properly, it seems to me, be regarded as 'unhealthy' -- and on investigation may well prove to lack adequate psychological, as well as adequate social, well-being.

Admittedly the risks identified by Callahan of medicalising all aspects of social life, of excessive medical control of, and of medical hubris concerning, human well-being all remain significant potential problems if social well-being remains a constituent component of the definition of health. However, not only is it arguably conceptually incoherent to exclude social well-being from any adequate account of the nature of human health -- we are after all social beings -- but perhaps, too, the dangers of doing so can be kept in check if the diagnosis of ill health is kept clearly separate from its treatment or management. Here we can accept Callahan's implicit advice that doctors are best at treating physical illness. Unlike Callahan we might perhaps agree that doctors are getting better at treating mental illness. And like Callahan we can agree that doctors don't have much expertise -- and probably shouldn't try to acquire it-- in treating social illness.

About sperm donors: I admit to having had my presuppositions shaken at first as I read this last chapter. But while of course Callahan's moral 'axiom' (pp. 225-226) that moral agents 'bear a moral responsibility for those voluntary acts that have an impact on the lives of others: they are morally accountable for such acts', is right. It follows of course that sperm donors are morally accountable for their sperm donation and therefore for helping to create a new life when their sperm is used successfully. But, pace Callahan, this does not entail that sperm-donating biological fathers have a continuing moral responsibility for the children thus created -- good try, but it simply doesn't follow! (And no, despite having been a medical student I never was a sperm donor).

A great book, constantly thought-provoking and constantly interesting, even when one disagrees with some of its claims and arguments, some of them no doubt modified by Callahan since he first presented them. In that regard I look forward to reading his recent memoir In Search of the Good: A Life in Bioethics (MIT Press 2012).