The Roots of Evil

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John Kekes, The Roots of Evil, Cornell University Press, 2005, 278pp, $29.95, ISBN 0801443687.

Reviewed by Thomas P. Flint, University of Notre Dame


John Kekes's aptly titled book endeavors to identify why moral evil occurs and what (if anything) can be done to lessen its occurrence. Arguing that evil results from combinations of propensities natural to human beings and external conditions that encourage or allow such propensities to operate unchecked, he maintains that a realistic understanding of evil leads us to see that, while endeavoring to eliminate it would be fatuous, we can and should take steps that should lower its incidence.

Kekes makes it clear from the start that his concern is not with minor, garden-variety cases of evil (e.g., taking apples or pears from another's tree) but with truly horrendous instances -- ones where the malefactors act out of genuine malevolence, where the harm they inflict on others is serious and (given their ends) excessive, and where no acceptable excuse for such action can be offered (p. 2). To illustrate the types of evil he has in mind, Kekes devotes the first part of his book to a discussion of six actual cases: the thirteenth-century crusade against the Cathars in France, the Reign of Terror under Robespierre during the French Revolution, the exterminations performed in Treblinka under Franz Stangle during World War II, the murders committed by Charles Manson and his "family" in California during the summer of 1969, the acts of torture and murder that were part of the "dirty war" in Argentina in the late 1970's, and the series of crimes committed by John Allen, a psychopath born in 1942.

In each of these cases, Kekes argues that we can discern a motive that was crucial to the evils that were committed. The crusaders were led by their Christian faith, a faith that left little room for reason and that told the knights that the defense of Christendom required the extermination of the Albigensians. Robespierre's infatuation with the political ideology of the Revolution convinced him that actions that otherwise would have been morally abhorrent were in fact morally required. Stangle, though pretending that his collaboration in the Holocaust was coerced, was actually moved primarily by his own personal ambition, and saw accepting the top post at Treblinka as the best means of furthering his career. Failure in his desire to succeed as a musician (or as anything else) led Manson to envy and hate those who had succeeded, and to manifest this envy and hate by striking back randomly at the society that he thought had wrongfully made him a failure. The "dirty warriors" in Argentina were moved by their identification with their position as military officers and the sense of honor that went with that position, a notion of honor that mandated their defending Argentina against the leftist insurgents they saw as endangering it. And John Allen killed, raped, stole, and dealt drugs to alleviate the boredom that he felt engulfing his life.

Even when such motives are recognized, trying to offer a full account for horrors of these types is not an easy job, and Kekes thinks many have looked in vain for simple explanations. Kekes highlights two worldviews -- the religious and the Enlightenment -- as the prime traditional culprits here. Adherents of the religious perspective insist that "a morally good order permeates the scheme of things" (3) and that, though evil results from defects in evildoers' reason or will, such evil somehow plays a part in maintaining the goodness of the whole. Enlightenment devotees insist that people are basically good, that failure to act as one should is simply a function of impaired rationality, and that evil is ultimately traceable to social (usually political) forces that can and should be rectified. Kekes maintains that each of these worldviews is overly optimistic, and each blinds us to the multiple factors that combine to produce the horrors we encounter.

Kekes spends the second part of his book presenting what he sees as a truer picture of the genesis of evil acts. As he sees it, "evil actions are caused by the combination of internal psychological propensities and external circumstances" (184). Both the internal and the external conditions have active and passive aspects. Take the case of Robespierre as an example. Internally, the motivational factor Kekes identifies in his case is his commitment to revolutionary ideology. This devotion was the active internal factor leading to his action. Robespierre had other propensities (e.g., a natural distaste for violence) that might have moderated his behavior, but political ideology was the dominant factor in Robespierre's life, the part that gave it meaning and significance for him, and so he kept passive and inactive such contrary inclinations. (In Robespierre as in all of his evildoers, Kekes detects a significant and willful lack of self-knowledge, a refusal to acknowledge facts about the world and especially about oneself that would call into question the propriety of the worldview one embraces and the actions one performs.) Internally, then, Robespierre was primed for the commission of atrocities. But this potentiality might never have amounted to much had not external factors collaborated to produce these horrors. The Revolution was already well under way before Robespierre rose to power; without it, says Kekes, he "might have spent his life as a provincial lawyer" (189). The Revolution provided the oxygen that enabled the potential blaze that Robespierre was to ignite. And the Revolution had also rendered inactive the ordinary social prohibitions against harming one's neighbors, prohibitions that, in more normal times, would have prevented Robespierre's proposals from gaining public acceptance.

Only by noting all of these factors -- internal and external, passive and active -- can we, according to Kekes, account for an evildoer such as Robespierre. And the same goes for all other evildoers. Of course, the specific factors we identify in each case will be different. Ambition, not ideology, motivated Stangle; the threat of Communist revolution, not the reality of the French Revolution, was the external factor leading the "dirty warriors" to perform acts they themselves would have despised in ordinary circumstances. And so on. The account of evil that we must offer, says Kekes, is irreducibly complex, and will have to vary with the case. But in most of these cases, passive and active internal and external factors can be uncovered sufficient to explain why the evil occurred.

If this is the type of explanation we must offer for the presence of evildoers, then (says Kekes) it is nonsense to think that we can do anything to eliminate them from our midst. The motives and passions that animate them are too much a part of human nature for us to eradicate even if we wanted to -- which we probably shouldn't, since some of the motives we have identified (ambition, honor, even the feeling of failure that engenders envy) can, if combined with an understanding of oneself and of the world, lead to great good. Nor can we fine-tune the social and political circumstances in which potential evildoers find themselves in such a way as to do away with external prods toward evil.

Since we cannot hope to eliminate evil, the best we can do is cope with it -- i.e., find ways to reduce its incidence and intensity. Kekes suggests three means of coping. First, we can encourage the creation of a fully secular picture of morality, one founded on the principle that people should get what they deserve. Second, we can cultivate what Kekes calls moral imagination, "the attempt to appreciate other ways of life by coming to understand them from the inside as they appear to those who are actively engaged in them" (236). Moral imagination lessens the tendency to dehumanize one's adversaries and allows one to grow in self-knowledge (by seeing oneself from the outside), thereby reducing the passion attached to the effort to defend one's own worldview against alternatives. Kekes suggests that returning to a focus on the classics in education is perhaps the best means of fostering moral imagination. Finally, we can institute "strong prohibitions of evil actions" (239). That is, we can make it clear to potential evildoers that they will be severely punished should they succumb to their anti-social propensities, and when this threat fails and evil occurs, we can follow through with punishments that are "swift, predictable, and severe" (240).

Any reader, even one who disagrees with some element in Kekes's analysis of evildoers, is likely to find much to admire in The Roots of Evil. The six examples of horrendous evil are described clearly and vividly, and Kekes's attempts to display the central motive in each case are generally quite convincing. This is especially true with respect to Manson: the identification of envy as the dominant passion leading to Manson's crimes is compelling, and the general discussion of envy is equally illuminating. The claims that evil can result from many psychological motives, that external societal factors often play a large role in determining whether such motives generate horrors, that it's foolish to think evil is an eliminable feature of life on earth -- all are presented clearly and persuasively. And it would be hard to argue with Kekes's suggestion that horrendous evils often result from a lack of self-knowledge, or to deny that the cultivation of moral imagination he prescribes might well serve to lessen this ignorance.

There is, then, much in this book to like. There are also a number of problems. Some of the difficulties concern fairly minor matters of fact. There are several places in the first, more historical part of the book where Kekes makes claims that are (at best) questionable; let me mention three. Kekes reports (on p. 13) that the Cistercian monk Arnold Amaury told the knights besieging the Albigensians in Breziers "Kill them all, God will know his own" -- a nice story, but (from what I've read) more legend than fact. In the same chapter, Kekes repeatedly says that the Catholic belief was that popes could never do evil, a misunderstanding of the Catholic position that seems to result from his conflating inerrancy of doctrinal pronouncement with inerrancy of personal action. Finally, in his discussion of psychopaths, Kekes reports (on p. 117) that schooling and crop rotation were utterly unknown at the close of the Middle Ages, claims that would no doubt have puzzled medieval scholars and farmers. My point in mentioning these slips is not to suggest that Kekes's overall argument is threatened by them; it clearly is not. Rather, errors on peripheral matters such as these (and, for all I know, readers with better historical background than I possess might detect others) inevitably diminish (if only by a bit) the confidence a reader has in the "facts" the author is employing to provide the empirical basis for his theoretical claims.

More troubling are the larger philosophical questions that Kekes ignores, or to which he devotes inadequate attention or offers inconsistent answers. The debate concerning determinism hovers in the background of many of Kekes' discussions of issues such as intention and responsibility, yet the reader will look in vain for any sustained discussion of it, or even for a forthright statement of Kekes's own view (though much that he says about responsibility suggests a rather unreflective version of compatibilism). Kekes does more openly state his position on both the religious and the Enlightenment worldviews, and does offer reasons (of a sort) for rejecting those views. The religious worldview improperly suggests that it's intellectually responsible to accept "what to reason appears unacceptable" (23) and thus (he implies) constitutes "an abuse of reason" (142). The Enlightenment view, in suggesting that humans are basically good, offers "a sentimental falsification of human propensities" (145) and naively fails to realize that political conditions cannot be the fundamental source of evil because "[u]ltimately … it is political conditions that must be explained with reference to the people who create and maintain them, rather than the other way around" (148). Whatever one's appraisal of the religious or Enlightenment positions, I think it should be clear that criticisms such as these are hardly fair or decisive. And, of course, if religious or Enlightenment outlooks are not discredited so easily as Kekes contends, their perspectives on evil (which, at least in the religious case, can be developed in a much more sophisticated manner than Kekes suggests) also cannot so readily be dismissed. Finally, though he repeatedly insists that evil actions are not necessarily contrary to reason -- e.g. "The history of moral thought is a graveyard of attempts to show that good actions are rational and evil actions are irrational" (156) -- he concludes his discussion of the psychopath John Allen by claiming that, though evildoers may have reasons to act as they do, "reasons against evil actions outweigh reasons for them" (117). Perhaps the latter claim is simply a slip, but it does seem clearly at odds with the position Kekes generally endorses.

A final warning concerning the book seems appropriate. Evil has been widely discussed among philosophers of religion in recent years, and much of the literature produced has (in my opinion at least) genuinely advanced the discussion. Readers, then, might expect that a book on evil will comment on at least some of this literature. If so, they will be disappointed with Kekes's work. One will search here in vain for even a mention of such contemporary luminaries as Plantinga, van Inwagen, Swinburne, or Rowe; Marilyn Adams and John Hick are mentioned in a single endnote, but their views are completely ignored. It would be somewhat unfair to criticize Kekes for failing to discuss these authors, since their focus is on a dimension of the problem of evil (namely, the compatibility of evil with the existence of God) in which Kekes, given his secular presuppositions, understandably has little if any interest. Still, readers should be aware that they should not expect Kekes to be addressing the issues involving evil that have elicited the greatest discussion over the last generation.