The Roots of Normativity

Roots Of Normativity

Joseph Raz, The Roots of Normativity, Ulrike Heuer (ed.), Oxford University Press, 2022, 306pp., $69.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780192847003.

Reviewed by Dale Dorsey, University of Kansas


The Roots of Normativity is a collection of twelve relatively recent essays by the late philosopher Joseph Raz, coupled with an introduction by the volume’s editor, Ulrike Heuer. Heuer suggests that they were chosen in part because they were unpublished or published in “more remote places,” making their selection for this volume quite welcome. The essays are split into three sections of four, titled “Normativity in Action” (which comprises a set of essays that involve questions regarding motivation, intention, and action), “Reasons and Values” (which articulates and defends Raz’s account of the nature of practical reasons, i.e., his “value-based” approach), and “The Normative in Our Lives,” which concerns a number of significant first-order questions and applications of his value-based approach.

The volume is admirably and clearly structured, and the introduction is informative and helpful. Ulrike Heuer should be offered strong congratulations on the task of editing such a volume, especially given the far-flung nature of the papers. The essays, in the main, begin with second-order topics (concerning such issues as, e.g., whether or not moral principles can change over time), and move on to more-and-more first-order issues (e.g., the weighing of practical reasons, promissory reasons, and the potential of reasons grounded in well-being or associate relations). Organizing things in this way was helpful for the reader because it is quite clear by the end of the volume that unless you had already absorbed and, well, accepted Raz’s more general accounts of the nature of reasons and their relationship to valuable states, and so forth, you were likely to get off the boat relatively early. Nevertheless, this volume presents Raz in what might be called an “adventurous” mood: pushing his more familiar doctrines in interesting and surprising ways.

Now, the adventurous nature of these essays cuts both ways. While it is exciting to see Raz develop some of his themes, it is also the case that much of the argument relies on the acceptance of starting points that have already been argued for or spelled out elsewhere in the Raz archives, and so those who are interested in engaging Raz on some of the more substantive points of the essays are bound to be disappointed, or at least to feel their views or intuitions are not being given proper consideration. For these reasons, this is probably not the essential “starting point” for engaging Raz, but something to be dipped into once one has his primary doctrines under their belt.

Given the space limitations of this review, I do not have the ability to assess all twelve of the essays contained herein. (I’ll just flag here one essay that I found very interesting and engaging, “Can Basic Moral Principles Change,” which struck me as novel and well-pursued.) Rather, I’ll focus on two that most piqued my interest.

The paper I consider to be the most provocative in the volume is essay nine, “The Role of Well-Being.” In this paper, Raz attempts to show that we don’t genuinely have reasons relating to facts about well-being. That something will make us better off is, in his view, no reason to perform the act. This is true in both first-personal contexts (i.e., I have no reason to promote my own well-being) and in the contexts of others (i.e., I have no reason to promote the well-being of, e.g., my children). That strikes me as a pretty surprising conclusion.[1]

But what is the argument for this surprising view? The answer has to do with Raz’s claim (in this essay it is little more than a stipulation) that well-being consists entirely in the successful pursuit of valuable projects and relationships. But, or so the argument goes, we do not simply engage in valuable projects for no reason; we see something valuable in those projects. If that’s right, then any reason we have to promote those projects doesn’t have to do with our well-being, but rather has to do with the value of the projects themselves.

This is an interesting implication. But Raz’s view of the nature of well-being is implausible, and it would have been nice to see Raz engaging with some of the work that takes this view on. For instance, Simon Keller (2004) has argued that well-being cannot consist solely in the successful pursuit of valuable goals. If Roger and Wilco both pursue some valueless goal g, and Roger succeeds where Wilco fails, this is surely a benefit for Roger rather than Wilco, even if we suppose that they both would have done better had g been a valuable rather than valueless goal. In addition, even if Raz were to allow success in valueless goals as bearing intrinsic value for a person, this cannot be the entire story of the nature of intrinsic value. Suppose Roger and Wilco both fail to obtain their goals to any extent. Their lives, surely, are to a large extent blighted. Roger, however, is able to tell his troubles to the barkeep at his local watering hole (a person he maintains no substantive friendship with), which brings him a lot of comfort and peace; Wilco, on the other hand, is unable to confide in anyone and is fully miserable as a result of it. Surely Roger has higher welfare than Wilco; of the two lives, Roger’s is better for the person who lives it.

If these reflections are correct, then Raz’s conclusion that we have no per se reason to improve the conditions of our lives is surely false. I have reason, for the sake of Wilco, to encourage him to seek a shoulder to cry on; I have reason, for the sake of myself, to make sure that even my valueless projects succeed. One further criticism of Raz’s argument here: the suggestion that we lack reason to promote our own well-being or the well-being of others, while a striking conclusion, seems to me a conclusion the truth of which, if true, ought to be true in a way that is neutral concerning substantive theories of well-being. In other words, whether or not we have such a reason shouldn’t turn on whether, e.g., goal-satisfaction, hedonism, objective list, or any other such view turns out to be the correct one in the final analysis. But Raz’s arguments violate this sensible dictum: only if you were already in for a pound on Raz’s picture would you be persuaded (which, in any event, you shouldn’t be).

I was also struck by the next essay, “Attachments and Associated Reasons.” Here Raz is attempting to provide a justification for partiality to one’s friends and family, problems which arise given his substantive account of reasons. For Raz, reasons are provided by facts of value. But if value is value, then, well, one wonders why one might have stronger reasons to favor, say, oneself or one’s near and dear. Summing up the problem, Raz writes:

But can [a value-based account of reasons] explain, for example, the value of a friendship to the friends? Assume that the friendship between Abby and Betty is good for both. Values being universal, the objection goes, it follows that there can be someone else, call her Carol, such that if Abby were friends with her their friendship would have the value to Abby that her friendship with Betty has. In that case, Abby has no reason not to replace her friendship with Betty with a friendship with Carol, assuming that she can do so. But that is clearly false. . . (245)

This seems like an important challenge. But it’s not clear that Raz’s response is adequate. Essentially, he argues that there are features in every friendship that make it unique—there’s just something about Betty that matters and is significant for Abby. (Raz suggests such diverse possibilities as “her awkward gait, her bent legs, her infuriating contrariness. . .it was with Betty she had her first satisfying sexual experience. . .it was Betty who nursed her back to health when she had pneumonia,” etc., (245–246).) Summing up, “so far as Abby is concerned, Betty is unique. She related to Abby in ways in which now no one else can” (246). But hang on. I thought the setup was that Carol’s friends “would have the value to Abby that her friendship with Betty has.” Is Raz meaning to deny this previous argumentative assumption? Or is he meaning to suggest that despite it, there are special reasons for Abby not to dump Betty in favor of Carol? Apparently neither: “We may [concede] that the new attachment is no less valuable than the lost one, and that it enriches our life no less than the lost one did, [but] nevertheless mourn the loss of the lost one (and not merely the circumstances of its loss)” (247). Now, I agree in toto. But it’s not clear that Raz’s own approach can accommodate it. We may actually mourn the loss of our past friendships while agreeing that our new ones are just as valuable. But it’s not clear that such a mournful attitude is appropriate, at least if we are tying reasons to the value of the relationship itself (which Raz does explicitly, cf. 253). For instance, I may choose a particular chocolate bar at the candy shop that looks amazing. But if I accidentally step on it, it makes no sense to mourn such an occurrence if my candy bar is replaced with one that is equally good (even if not chocolate!)

However, the most significant worry for the approach to partiality suggested by Raz’s underlying account is his forced denial of the claim that we have rational partiality to ourselves. After a short discussion of whether humans are generally partial to themselves (255–256), he considers “favouring the advancement of one’s own well-being over other ends that, on the relevant occasion, one believes oneself to have a better reason to pursue” (257). Now, of course, because he denies that well-being provides reason (which I have already argued is substantially suspect), this issue doesn’t really arise. But, or so he says, “partiality to oneself need not manifest itself in giving undue weight to an alleged reason to serve one’s own well-being. It could consist simply in choosing an option that favours one’s well-being when whatever reasons support that option are defeated by reasons for an alternative and incompatible one” (258). And here is Raz’s verdict on such a proposal: “If so then partiality to self has to be treated as a motivational malformation.”

Now, the way Raz describes it, it does seem like a motivational malformation. But consider how far we’ve come from anything resembling commonsense. I can think of no one who understands partiality to self in such terms. Commonsensically, we think that partiality to self means that we, perhaps rationally, prefer a larger good for ourselves to a larger good to another, leaving all else equal. The question of whether we have reasons to do so, or whether reasons require us to choose the larger good to others is the question to be solved when we think about whether such partiality is justified. To simply understand partiality to oneself as contrary to the balance of reasons can only be sensibly motivated by an embedded commitment to an account of reasons that is leads one very far astray; an account of reasons that this way of understanding partiality to oneself gives us every reason to reject.

While I have substantive criticisms of the essays, it is exciting to get the sense while reading them that one is watching Raz draw out his view as far as it can possibly go. And while I cannot recommend this book to, say, the advanced undergraduate or graduate student who wants to figure out or work on a thesis that involves the various topics Raz explores here, I can nevertheless offer my unwavering recommendation for those with an interest in the depth of Raz’s engaging thought. One might think of this volume as a collection of B-sides or alternate takes—fascinating for the completist, but perhaps not where the casual fan would spend dollar one.


Dorsey, Dale (2021). A Theory of Prudence. Oxford.

Keller, Simon (2004). “Welfare and the Achievement of Goals” in Philosophical Studies 121.

[1] Though it is one I myself have argued for in a slightly different context and to different ends; cf. Dorsey (2021), ch. 9.