The Roots of Reason: Philosophical Essays on Rationality, Evolution, and Probability

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Papineau, David, The Roots of Reason: Philosophical Essays on Rationality, Evolution, and Probability, Oxford, 2003, 239pp, $29.95 (hbk), ISBN 0199243840.

Reviewed by Horacio Arlo Costa, Carnegie Mellon University


This volume gathers together five essays on related topics that the author has published in various journals since 1997. In addition chapter 5 (on causality) is entirely new. Chapter 4 on probability was originally written in collaboration with Helen Beebee. The book succeeds at presenting an articulated and coherent view in various areas of epistemology and philosophy of science, treating a series of issues ranging from the foundations of decision theory and probability to various interesting problems in the cognitive sciences.

The first three chapters center on classical epistemological issues as well as on certain aspects of the evolution of cognition. Together they present a forceful and original naturalistic account, which, at times, is directly at odds with widespread philosophical views on the nature of content, knowledge and the aims of inquiry. The last three chapters on probability, causation and quantum mechanics form another cohesive part of the book. Even when the topics discussed in these last three chapters are of a more technical nature, they are presented in a very accessible and readable manner.

The first chapter focuses on normativity and judgment. One of the basic ideas articulated in this chapter is that all ’oughts’ relating to judgments are derived oughts, arising because personal or moral value is attached to the pursuit of truth, understood as a fundamental goal of inquiry. In other words, norms of judgment are ’prescriptions to the effect that, in order to achieve the truth, you ought to judge in such and such way (p. 7)’. The author seems to be interested in the normativity of methods for forming, fixing and changing beliefs not only in the context of scientific inquiry, but also in everyday reasoning.

This naturalist approach to normativity stands opposed to most contemporary theories of content, which tend not to be of a naturalist type. Section 3, in chapter 1, presents some problems for non-naturalism and section 6 develops a more refined analysis of the spectrum of theories of content which might cohere with the author’s naturalist account of norms.

Papineau classifies methods for fixing belief externally in terms of how good they are in producing certain outputs, namely in yielding true pieces of information. In order to do so truth is assumed as a primitive used by the theorist in order to classify methods of belief fixation. So, the notion of truth that arises from this consequentialist analysis cannot be equated with some form of ’rational assertibility.’ And the corresponding notion of aiming at truth cannot be construed either in terms of warranted assertibility, as authors like Crispin Wright and Davidson have recently proposed.1 Here Papineau has to face some contemporary arguments to the effect that the enterprise of seeking truth is incoherent when truth is not equated with warranted assertibility:

We know many things, and will learn more; what we will never know for certain is which of the things we believe are true. Since it is neither visible as a target, nor recognizable when achieved, there is no point in calling truth a goal. Truth is not a value, so the “pursuit of truth” is an empty enterprise unless it means only it is often worthwhile to increase our confidence in our beliefs, by collecting further evidence or checking our calculations. From the fact that we will never be able to tell which of our beliefs is true, pragmatists conclude that we may as well identify our best researched, most successful, beliefs with the true ones, and give up the idea of objectivity. (Truth is objective if the truth of a belief or sentence is independent of whether it is justified by all our evidence, believed by our neighbors or is good to steer by.) But here we have a choice. Instead of giving up the traditional view that truth is objective, we can give up the equally traditional view (to which the pragmatists adhere) that truth is a norm, something for which to strive. I agree with the pragmatists that we can’t consistently take truth to be both objective and something to be pursued. But I think they would have done better to cleave to a view that counts truth as objective, but pointless as a goal. (Davidson, 1998, pp.2-3.)

The view rests on a familiar articulation of fallibilism, according to which held information is always polluted by doubt. A thorough probabilism (and anti-inductivism) in philosophy of science, for example, is a position compatible with this account. The pursuit of truth under this point of view is deflated to the mere enterprise of increasing the degree of credence in our beliefs, gathering further evidence and checking calculations. Papineau sketches a response in footnote 5 of chapter two (p. 48). The idea is to compare different methods by their outputs and to invoke as well theoretical considerations, in order to figure out which method is unreliable for truth. This response broadens the consequentialist approach defended throughout the book, but ultimately the reader is referred to a previous book for precisions about this issue.2

Papineau seems to recognize as well that seeking truth cannot be the sole relevant goal when it comes to classifying methods of belief formation. ’There seems no good reason to privilege the desideratum of reliability for truth over others when we evaluate methods of belief formation. True, an economical method that generates lots of important falsehoods is not generally worth much. But neither is a reliable method that consumes costly resources in generating trivialities (p. 22).’ It also seems (see p. 79) that when the goal of seeking truth is invoked it is taken as a proximate goal of inquiry, rather than a goal to be achieved in the long run.3 This seems to bring the offered theory closer to well-established decision-theoretic accounts of belief fixation, where seeking truth is articulated as the pursuit of valuable error-free information in the next step of inquiry.4 Nevertheless, according to Papineau a method of belief fixation is ’epistemically rational’ as long as it is specifically reliable-for-truth. Methods exhibit ’wide theoretical rationality’ when they produce an optimal mix of the different desiderata imposed on them. Even when epistemic rationality seems to offer a narrow view of rationality (for the reasons specified by the author himself in the quote above), epistemic rationality is the standard of rationality that drives much of the discussions about the evolution of knowledge in chapter two.

In chapters two and three an evolutionary perspective is used in order to explain how beings with our evolutionary story come to be so good at theoretical rationality. The discussion touches interesting issues related to the status of experimental findings in psychology, which seem to indicate the presence of widespread irrationality in human agents. In page 42 Papineau offers a menu of some of the classical experiments, which seem to indicate that normal subjects in experimental settings ignore base rates, violate basic laws of probability, etc. The author uses results from evolutionary psychology and behavioral decision making, in order to conclude that ’ it is agreed on all sides that human thinking depends on ’quick and dirty’ problem-solving strategies which often go astray in modern environments’. So, when evaluated via the consequentialist approach used in the book, human subjects are not ’epistemically rational’. Papineau wonders whether we are ’widely theoretically rational’ after all, but the thought is not pursued further. What matters for him is that the data indicates an apparent failure of epistemic rationality. So, he asks, rhetorically, ’If we’re so dumb, how come we sent a man to the moon?’ His straightforward answer is that we have the ability to deliberately identify ways of thinking that are reliable for truth and set ourselves to practice them. One of the main issues in chapters two and three is how are we evolutionarily capable of doing this in spite of our biological limitations (i.e. in spite of the fact that our mind operates as a Swiss Army knife, comprising an array of ’fast and frugal’ modules designed to solve specific problems quickly). The solution offered by Papineau is ingenious, although in many crucial aspects it remains sketchy. First, one has to suppose that our ancestors were capable of identifying the end of truth and that they knew how to achieve it.5 Second, Papineau needs to postulate that evolution selects the desire for truth. Third, he has to explain the relationship between the outputs of ’fast and frugal’ modules and our best theories of rationality. His idea is that the outputs of the modules are not supplanted by rational outputs. When rationality and the fast modules give conflicting answers, the agent retains both of them. This goes smoothly with the idea that in most psychological experiments we are the victims of ’cognitive illusions’ sustained by hard-wired modules giving responses in conflict with the recommendations of rationality at the time. So, the situations in psychological experiments would work as the cognitive counterpart of the visual illusion one suffers in looking at the Muller-Lyer lines. The two lines look different lengths to you, and moreover they continue to do so even when you know that they are the same length. The means-ends reasoning that goes into selecting epistemically rational methods is explained at length in chapter three.

As I said above Papineau’s proposals are ingenious, and they might go a long way towards explaining some of the current data on irrationality. I think, nevertheless, that the ultimate view of theoretical rationality on which the proposal is based relies too much on ’the standard psychological understanding of the experimental data on irrationality’ (p. 54). Perhaps the ideas of the author can be successfully used in order to explain ’framing’ situations, where one and the same option is ’framed’ differently, leading to preference reversals and other inadequacies. But most of the data that inspired the initial work of the ’heuristics and biases community’ is based on rather different type of phenomena, which are usually classified as ’paradoxes’ of rationality. Examples are the so-called paradoxes of Allais and Ellsberg. These paradoxes seem to question the hardcore of the received views on rationality by challenging the normative validity of some of its central axioms. The seminal work of the psychologists Daniel Kahneman and Amos Tversky seemed to have proceeded in a different manner. Their idea is to develop a theoretical framework (prospect theory) capable of describing robust patterns of human behavior which violate basic axioms of rationality, without at the same time challenging the received view on normative standards of rationality. In other words, in the face of recalcitrant evidence a normative view of rationality can either be revised descriptively or normatively. When the revision is done descriptively, the violating behavior is interpreted as irrational and explained as a blind spot of a cognitive strategy that normally yields reasonable results. When the revision is done normatively the idea is that the violating behavior is, after all, rational. The paradoxical situation is then seen as revealing a theoretical defect in the received view, not as a cognitive illusion. Papineau’s position is aligned with the idea of explaining violating behavior as irrational, as in the Kahneman-Tversky tradition. But there are compelling reasons for seeing the phenomena studied in psychology experiments on (alleged) irrationality as reminders of the inadequacies of the orthodox theories of rationality,6 rather than as ’cognitive illusions’.

One of the main question that Papineau asks in this part of the book is: ’If the ordinary intuitions of ordinary people don’t support objective standards of rationality, then what is the status of these standards? What makes it right to reason in certain ways, even when reasoning in those ways seems unnatural to most people?’ (p. 46) A quick answer to the last question could be ’Nothing’. When the orthodox view is revised normatively in a sufficiently sophisticated way, phenomena of recalcitrant irrationality are minimized.7 Some of the most successful approaches are sensible to the fact that in common decision situations our values are indeterminate and our probabilities imprecise.8 There is, to be sure, an interesting philosophical debate as to which revised normative standards one should adopt. Rather than taking this path Papineau does not question the orthodox view. Every time that the (postulated) ’fast and frugal’ modules yield a response conflicting with the recommendations of the orthodox view on rationality, it is this latter recommendation that is labeled as epistemically rational. One can extract, nevertheless, completely opposed lessons from psychological experiments. Why, for example, is the pattern of choice violating Savage axioms in the Ellsberg paradox intrinsically irrational?9 There are perfectly good manners of accommodating this behavior as rational by, for example, recognizing that in this situation probabilities are indeterminate (and accommodating this by, in turn, rejecting the axiom of ordering).10 It seems to me that the experimental evidence of the last thirty years or so does not paint such a bleak picture regarding our everyday irrationality. The data might be seen instead as providing interesting insights as to what are the desiderata and the limits of an adequate theory of normative rationality. Papineau might be right though in reporting that this is not the dominant view among contemporary psychologists. He also takes for granted this view and incorporates it as corroborating evidence in favor of his account on the evolution of knowledge. I remain considerably less convinced than Papineau by the tenets of this research program in psychology. Evolutionary psychology, with its picture of the mind as a Swiss Army knife, is perhaps an even more questionable source of insights about cognitive structure, in the light of its many methodological fragilities. But perhaps Papineau can run his evolutionary arguments without appealing heavily to either branch of contemporary psychology.

In a nutshell, at least some of the most salient experimental results in psychology and economics (like the ones related to the Ellsberg paradox) seem to call for a revision of our best theories of rationality, rather than being corroborating data in support of the heuristics and biases research program. Of course, there are countless ways in which agents might fail to meet normative standards of rationality. Normative standards are not met in an effortless manner, even when theoretically more adequate. Papineau is right in pointing to the fact that one of our distinctive abilities as a species is being able to create institutions that help us in implementing normative standards. And perhaps he is also right in insisting that the pursuit of truth has played a central evolutionary role in shaping this ability. It is more contentious to determine how exactly one should articulate the goal of seeking truth and how the goal is related to a general and (more) adequate normative theory of rationality.

Chapter five focuses on re-examining the debate between ’evidential’ and ’causal’ decision theorists. Papineau’s idea is to discuss the issue by taking into account new papers defending the ’evidential’ side of the discussion. One of these papers is a recent piece by Christopher Meek and Clark Glymour.11 This paper, together with similar pieces written independently by other authors, focuses on determining the shape of decision rules for agents who know the causal relationships of a given problem. Since this knowledge is encoded in the form of a directed graph it is not trivial how to adapt standard decision theory to this particular case. This new wave of papers and books does introduce a novel spin on the on-going debate in the foundations of causal decision theory. So, Papineau is quite right in selecting this material in order to re-examine the debate. Ultimately he wants to argue that there are some examples that this new type of evidentialism cannot handle. Here is one of these examples:

Suppose you are considering whether to have a cigarette, and are concerned to avoid getting lung cancer. Whether or not you have a cigarette is a chance function of two factors, whether you consciously decide to smoke, D, and probabilistically independent presence of a certain psychologically undetectable addictive chemical, H, in your bloodstream. (Thus, for example, you are 99.9 percent certain to smoke if you decide to, and have H; 95 percent if you decide to, and lack H; still, 40 percent likely to smoke if you decide not to, yet have H, and 1 percent if you decide not to, and don’t have H). Now suppose further that H causes lung cancer, quite separately from inducing people to smoke. Smoking itself, however, doesn’t cause lung cancer. Among people with H, cancer is equally likely whether or not they smoke and similarly among people without H. And suppose finally, that you know all this.

Papineau’s intuition is that in this case you should recommend smoking. He also thinks that ’there seems no good way for evidentialists to recommend smoking’ in this case (p. 199). The causal structure that the author seems to have in mind in this example can be presented graphically as follows:


We can also calculate P(LC = 1 | D = 0) via this procedure, which illustrates the method of proof in the so-called Manipulation Theorem.13 It is not particularly difficult for the evidentialist to accommodate the preference for the decision to smoke in this circumstance (i.e. in all cases where the value of (LC = 1 | D = 1) does not exceed the value of P(LC = 1 | D = 1)). So, at first sight the position of the evidentialist is not so hopeless here. The concrete example used by Papineau in order to present a problem for the evidentialist is actually easy to handle via an adaptation of the Manipulation Theorem.

Now, one should remark here, on behalf of the spirit if not the letter of Papineau’s objection, that there is no published complete theory of how to set up interventions in order to solve decision problems of the kind he has in mind.14 For example, if there is a causal influence from S to LC (even a slight one) it seems that the procedure sketched above gives incorrect results.15 There is perhaps a different interpretation of manipulation (more in line with Pearl’s ideas about the use of truncated Markov factorizations).16 Intervening in order to set S either to 1 or to 0 can be seen as a hypothetical policy that either prohibits or mandates smoking. In this case the idea could be to truncate the graph by deleting all arrows from direct parents of S to S (i.e. the arrow from DS to S and the arrow from H to S). This intervention yields more reasonable results in the case in which there is causal influence from S to LC – and avoids having to use probabilities like P(S|DS).

Towards the end of this chapter Papineau considers a harder case, namely:

17 The gist of this rival of conditioning is that the revision of a mixture of two probability functions is the mixture of the revisions. When ’causal decision theory’ is presented in this general way, it is quite clear that the theory need not apply only to causal problems. John Collins has argued, for example, that a theory of this sort can make sense of an anti-Humean account of motivation (which is otherwise incompatible with conditioning, and therefore with most ’evidential’ decision theories).18 But in cases of this sort there might not be interventions available, for the simple reason that there is no causal structure for the problem to begin with. The intervention approach can only be applied to cases where this causal structure is indeed available.

In a nutshell, to the extent that Papineau’s examples are examples of rational decisions at all, it seems that unmodified versions of them can be handled by applying the Manipulation Theorem. But there is a delicate philosophical point raised in this chapter about the nature of interventions in graphs containing decision nodes, which actually might be at the center of discussions about the foundations of causal decision theory. This point, I think, remains open and valid.

Chapter four elaborates the connection between means-end reasoning and probability. It also intends to offer an account of probability useful in chapter five. Papineau argues that the relevant notion is not chance but what he calls knowledge-relative probability, i.e. the objective probability of results relative to those circumstances the agent knows about.

Finally chapter six proposes a puzzle. Suppose that there is a machine that produces two kinds of quantum-mechanical-devices. When operated (’spun’) either device displays either H or T. The first device is H-biased, giving H a 0.9 chance and T a 0.1 chance. The second device is T-biased having H a 0.3 chance and T a 0.7 chance. The machine itself proceeds on quantum-mechanical basis, and on any occasion there is a 0.6 chance of an H-biased device, and a 0.4 chance of a T-biased one. What is then the estimated probability of H(T)? Here is an option: there is a 0.66 probability of H (0.6 x 0.9 + .4 x 0.3) and so a 0.34 probability of T. Papineau mounts a defense of these knowledge-relative probabilities by appealing to the many-minds interpretation of quantum mechanics.19

There are interesting and fruitful continuities throughout chapters four to six, as well as some tensions. In general chapters four and six seem to be more open to an ’evidential’ view of probability and choice than chapter five, which defends causal decision theory. The tension, for example, is revealed when the author offers an argument for conditionalization in chapter six. Many defenders of causal decision theory think that conditioning gives the wrong kind of account of the act of supposing that enters into the calculation of expected utility.20 Actually the appeal to intervention can be seen as a maneuver in order to give an account of imaging in terms of conditioning plus relevant manipulations in a directed graph. But the main topic of chapter five is to reject the intervention method as a possible reduction of this kind. Perhaps Papineau is appealing here to a distinction between temporal conditionalization and the act of supposing, as encoded by different update methods.

I thoroughly enjoyed reading this book. Even in partial disagreement with some of its main ideas and presuppositions, I did find the book quite intellectually stimulating and insightful. Can the naturalist find good foundational answers when facing open and interesting problems in the evolution of cognition, the theory of choice and the philosophy of probability? Papineau does a superb job at answering these questions.

The book is very well written. Its arguments flow quite naturally and clearly, even in areas where technicalities could have impaired the transparency of the exposition. The book deals with almost all the main puzzles that matter in the area of rational choice as well as with interesting repercussions in broader areas in the philosophy of mind and cognition, evolution and epistemology. I do recommend reading the book to any person with interests overlapping any of these areas.


1. See, Wright, C. (1992), Truth and Objectivity, Cambridge, Mass.: Harvard U. Press; as well as Davidson, D. (1998), “Truth Rehabilitated,” to be published.

2. Papineau, D. (1987) Reality and Representation, Oxford, Blackwell.

3. A reliabilist account where the goal is convergence to the truth in the long run is fully articulated by Kevin Kelly, in Kelly, K. (1996) The Logic of Reliable Inquiry, Oxford: Oxford University Press. This does not seem, nevertheless, the kind of reliabilism that Papineau has in mind.

4. Levi, I. (1980), The Enterprise of Knowledge, Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press. See also a recent manuscript where the type of neo-pragmatism that motivated Davidson’s quote above is criticized for not being a good reflection of the views of the classical American pragmatists: Levi, I. ’Seeking Truth,’ manuscript, Columbia University, April 2000.

5. This issue is obviously connected with topics treated in the first chapter about whether seeking truth can be differentiated from the point of view of the inquirer from warranted assertibility.

6. This applies as well to the phenomena that Papineau has chosen in order to illustrate the idea that there is widespread irrationality in the standard behavior of human subjects. The so-called conjunction fallacy seem to depend crucially on how the words ’probability’ and ’and’ are interpreted and framed; and in the case of ’taxicab’ problems many have noted that it follows from updating through conditionalization and Bayes theorem that the use of the precise base rate relative to the less specific reference class cannot be consistently required. See K. Tentori, N. Bonini and D. Osherson, (2003) ’Conjunction and the Conjunction Fallacy,’ University of Trento and Princeton University; as well as J. Koehler (1996) ’The base rate fallacy reconsidered: Descriptive, normative and methodological challenges’, Brain and Behavioral Sciences, 19:1 (as well as various responses to the target article).

7. The residue of irrational phenomena are, in this approach, the so-called ’framing’ effects. These are the effects most similar to visual illusions, and the ones that cannot be easily accommodated in a weakened version of the classical normative theory of rationality.

8. Levi, I. (1986) ’The paradoxes of Allais and Ellsberg,’ Economics and Philosophy, 2, 23-56.

9. Not being open to ’money pumps’ could be a minimal constraint on possible revisions of the received view on normative standards of rationality. One might argue that some of the alternative proposals do not manage to meet this constraint. ’Regret theory’, for example, fails to enforce the transitivity of preferences and it is therefore open to such criticisms. But not all normative revisions (especially the ones which relinquish ordering) suffer from this problem.

10. Craig R. Fox and Amos Tversky follow the opposite strategy by explaining the Ellsberg paradox in terms of what they call a ’comparative ignorance effect’ (see (1991) ’Ambiguity Aversion and Comparative Ignorance,’ Quarterly Journal of Economics, 110:3, 585-603). The gist of the idea is that a form of ambiguity aversion will be present when individuals evaluate clear and vague prospects jointly. The explanatory strategy consists in postulating a ’psychological effect’ which explains away the failure to obey otherwise correct norms of rationality. This is consistent with the ’heuristics and biases’ program, and with the explanatory strategy of the author, but certainly does not coincide with Ellsberg’s views about his own problem (stated in the same journal thirty years earlier). Here is Ellsberg’s own diagnosis: ’Thus none of the familiar criteria for predicting or prescribing decision-making under uncertainty corresponds to this pattern of choices. Yet the choices themselves do not appear to be careless or random. They are persistent, reportedly deliberate, and they seem predominate empirically; many of the people who take them are eminently reasonable, and they insist that they want to behave this way, even though they may be generally respectful of the Savage axioms. There are strong indications, in other words, not merely of the existence of reliable patterns of blind behavior but of the operation of definite normative criteria, different from and conflicting with the familiar ones, to which these people are trying to conform.’ The paragraph is from page 654 of Ellsberg, D. (1961) ’Risk, ambiguity, and the Savage axioms,’ Quarterly Journal in Economics, 75, 643-669.

11. Meek, C. and Glymour, C. (1994) ’Conditioning and Intervening,’ British Journal for the Philosophy of Science, 45.

12. I am assuming (as Papineau does) that the agent knows the initial graph and that the probabilities of the manipulated graph can be easily estimated. This avoids further complications linked to the Bayesian credentials of the type of causal inference we are considering here. There is a further issue related to the interpretation of the probabilities of the truncated graph. Consider for example P(S | DS = 0). Perhaps one possible interpretation of P(S | DS = 0) is in terms of the probabilities of a reflective agent who is thinking about himself as a third person. Then, for example, the aforementioned probability can be moderately high if you are predicting that you will be a victim of weakness of the will. It is not immediately clear to me whether this interpretation is compatible with the one proposed by Papineau in chapter four.

13. Spirtes, P., Glymour, C. and Scheines, R. (2000) Causation, Prediction and Search, second edition, Cambridge, Mass.: MIT Press, theorem 3.6, p. 51.

14. One notable exception is: Spohn, W. (2001) ’Dependency equilibria and the causal structure of decision and game situations,’ Logik in Der Philosophie, Universitat Konstanz, Nr. 56.

15. Clark Glymour suggested this point in conversation. I am grateful to him for various remarks and observations regarding the use of the Manipulation Theorem.

16. See Pearl, J. (2000) Causality: Models, reasoning and inference, Cambridge University Press, p. 72, section 3.2.3.

17. See, for example, Joyce, J.M. (1999) The Foundations of Causal Decision Theory, Cambridge University Press, Cambridge.

18. See: Collins, J. (1996) ’Supposition and Choice: Why `Causal Decision Theory’ is a misnomer, manuscript,’ Columbia University.

19. The author notices as well that in this case the chance of H is either 0.9 or 0.3 depending on the device you have. Nevertheless, it is worth noticing in passing that Papineau’s knowledge-probabilities can also be seen as the chance for the coin landing heads on the compound trial consisting of running the first chance device (which determines the bias of the coin-flipping machine) followed by flipping the coin. I am grateful here to Teddy Seidenfeld who suggested this remark in conversation.

20. Notice that Papineau is committed to maximize (where Ri are results) (CEU) (Σm i = 1 u(Ri) P(Ri\Aj), where: P(.\Aj) = (ΣK P(K) P(./Aj&K), and where K is a partition dependency hypothesis. But as Joyce clearly explains in his recent book (cited above) for each recommendation according to this method there is an imaging operator `\’ that outputs the same recommendations. So, commitment to (CEU) seems to translate into commitment to imaging as the right encoding of supposition in maximizing expected utility.