The Rules of Rescue: Cost, Distance, and Effective Altruism

Rules of Rescue

Theron Pummer, The Rules of Rescue: Cost, Distance, and Effective Altruism, Oxford University Press, 2023, 253pp., $32.99 (hbk), ISBN 9780190884147.

Reviewed by Violetta Igneski, McMaster University


Theron Pummer’s book, The Rules of Rescue: Cost, Distance, and Effective Altruism, provides a thoroughly engaging discussion of the moral reasons and requirements we have to use our time and resources to help others. After quickly dismissing act consequentialism for its implausibility and inability to accommodate moral permissions and constraints, Pummer constructs a nonconsequentialist picture that relies heavily on intuitive responses to a series of stylized examples. His account then goes further by offering a coherent set of explanations for these intuitive responses. While these explanations are of limited value to those who do not share Pummer’s intuitions, or to those with limited patience for hypothetical cases, the examples serve an important function in isolating various salient considerations and assessing their moral significance. The main project is to provide a series of moral rules for when we are and are not required to rescue persons in nearby emergency situations, and then to show that these rules apply in more realistic everyday contexts in which we can use our time and resources to help people in need of food, shelter, and medical care who are neither immediately before us nor members of our local community.

Pummer supports a version of effective altruism—best known for its being morally demanding, issuing in a duty to do the most good one can— reconciled with a comparatively moderate view more closely tracking common sense morality. Pummer’s view is that we are not always required to provide the most help possible. In line with his nonconsequentialist position, his view accepts both moral constraints (things you may be morally required not to do, even if they bring about the most good) and moral permissions (permissions not to help in the way that brings about the most good). For those in the moderate camp, who nevertheless believe we have strong duties to help others, Pummer puts together an attractive picture of how the strong moral requirement to help others may sometimes yield to cost-based reasons and autonomy-based reasons. Moreover, these permissions can be amplified by the costs we have (or will have) incurred by helping over the course of our lifetimes and by special considerations for those with whom we are connected.

In the first four chapters of the book, Pummer defends a series of moral rules about the ethics of rescuing nearby strangers by appealing to intuitions about hypothetical “clean” rescue cases. In chapter one, he sets out the basic framework in which he distinguishes between two types of moral reasons: requiring reasons that contribute toward making an act required and permitting reasons that contribute toward making an act permissible without also contributing to making it required (25). In chapter two, he argues, in line with common intuitions, that it is wrong to save a lesser number of strangers rather than a greater number of strangers. In chapters three and four, he explains the reasons behind seemingly counterintuitive views such as “we must save the greater number even when it is permissible to save no one”; “it is conditionally permissible to save only one person given that you aren’t going to save both”; and “it can be praiseworthy to do the wrong act (if you save some)”. After drawing out our intuitions in response to some hypothetical examples where these judgements feature, he provides a more principled explanation for what he takes to be the correct response. For example, the reason we must save the greater number even when it is permissible to save no one is that there is a sufficiently strong permitting reason to do nothing, but no sufficiently strong permitting reason to save the lesser number (64). The aim of the last four chapters of the book is to show how far these “rules of rescue” apply in other more complicated and realistic contexts that involve the use of time and money to help distant strangers. He considers a number of differences between nearby rescue cases and distant rescue cases such as distance, salience, uniqueness, injustice, and diffusion, and argues that they do not make a morally relevant difference. Accordingly, these differences do not show that it is wrong not to help in the nearby case but permissible not to help in the distant case (chapters 5–7). The final chapter argues that the rules of rescue carry over to a significant range of real-world cases.

The central simple cases Pummer relies on are familiar. There is Charity and Pond. In Pond we can rescue one person at the cost of $6000. In Charity, we can save a life by donating $3000 to a malaria charity. So, in a conflict situation where you have only $6000, there is a moral requirement to save two people in Charity, and it would be impermissible to instead rescue the one person in Pond. Barring any further complications or morally relevant considerations, Pummer’s answer is the same as Peter Singer’s (1972) (and most effective altruists’). In the absence of any moral constraints or moral permissions, we are morally required to save the greater number. This is so even if it means that we pass by the child drowning in the shallow pond as we are on our way to drop off a cheque to the Malaria Fund. For an account that is fundamentally built around common intuitions, this is one where I expect many readers (including myself) will disagree. Pummer addresses this skepticism by considering the standard reasons that have been given in the literature for morally distinguishing these cases, such as distance, frequency of opportunities to help over one’s lifetime, and special connections. This discussion is fruitful and offers some new insights into when these reasons can serve as moral permissions not to help the greater number (note: distance never does, but costs over a lifetime and special connections do). He briefly considers an exception for cases of “risky diffusion” where there is very little chance of saving the greater number of people (122). In such a case, we would be required, or at the very least permitted to rescue the one rather than donate to save the two. And while one could further pursue this line of reasoning by arguing that real-world cases of aiding are often like this, it does not explain the intuitive difficulty in the clear case of Charity and Pond.

That said, it seems a lost opportunity not to have considered more fully the political and institutional differences between cases like Pond and Charity. A compelling case has recently been made by Larry Temkin (2022). Drawing on economist Angus Deaton’s 2013 critique of traditional development aid, Temkin argues that supporting charities and development agencies does not bring about the most good and may even bring about more harm than good. We can create more harm by imposing the views of the affluent on the poor, and also by undermining or disincentivizing the building of accountable, local democratic institutions. This also brings to light a serious concern raised by Monique Deveaux that focusing on the duties of the affluent fails to put the poor at the centre of an effective response to poverty, thus failing to fully respect their agency and to target the political subordination at the heart of poverty (2021). The worry is that even if Pummer develops fully acceptable rules of rescue, it does not follow that the rules for charitable giving or addressing the conditions of poverty will be the same. We must first respond to the skeptical accounts that do not take for granted that charities “save” lives in the same way that pulling drowning people out of shallow ponds does.

Another limitation is that getting on board with Pummer’s view will depend on finding the claims he makes about his stylized cases intuitive. As noted, the account goes deeper than merely giving a series of interesting cases to elicit concurring intuitive responses; it explains them. However, finding the explanations compelling will depend on whether one shares his intuitive responses at the outset. At each main junction, he notes that those who disagree can fill in an alternative explanation, but this is not entirely satisfying. My worry is less that people do not share Pummer’s intuitions, and more that those who do are seeking a deeper justification of the moderate position. For example, a deeper exploration of the grounding of autonomy-based permissions is important for understanding why and to what extent they can overcome strong requiring reasons. While I appreciate the imagery of permitting reasons as a breakwater that can be built up enough to withstand the vast tide of requiring reasons, its usefulness is limited in practice if we first need to figure out how strong a particular permitting reason needs to be to prevent the balance of requiring reasons from making an act wrong (189). One way to do so would be to compare and contrast the grounds of the permitting and requiring reasons, but for this, one needs a deeper account of these grounds. Moreover, Pummer seems to assume that the requiring reasons and permitting reasons are going to meet in the moderate middle, but how can we be so sure? How do we determine the relative strength of the breakwater and the reasons that keep crashing against it? It is in this difficult grey zone where we need more guidance.

Pummer’s book is certainly worth engaging with, especially for those interested in questions about our duties to aid and the demandingness problem in ethics. This book will appeal to researchers and students of ethics, development aid, and people with a general interest in knowing how they should be acting in the face of great need. It tells us that we must help people in the most effective way we can, while recognizing that there will be cases where there are strong cost-based or autonomy-based reasons, or special obligations that justify not saving the most people. As a contribution to this debate, this is a good start, but it must be supplemented by a recognition that aid is politically complex, and that the right way forward must take us beyond the duties and responsibilities of the affluent by bringing the poor back into the picture. Otherwise, we will never fully address the political subordination and institutional injustice that put people in need of aid in the first place.


Peter Singer, “Famine, Affluence, and Morality”, Philosophy and Public Affairs, 1972, 1: 229–43.

Larry Temkin, Being Good in a World of Need. Oxford University Press, 2022.

Angus Deaton, The Great Escape: Health, Wealth, and the Origins of Inequality, Princeton University Press, 2013.

Monique Deveaux, Poverty, Solidarity, and Poor-Led Social Movements, Oxford University Press, 2021.