This book is about a lot of things, but fundamentally it is about the philosophy of philosophy. In it, Jonathan Jenkins Ichikawa and Benjamin Jarvis cover a wide and difficult terrain as they defend a rationalist conception of philosophy: "philosophical traditionalism". This is the view that "philosophical inquiry is, in certain canonical cases, a priori inquiry into the essential natures of objects, properties and relations" (2). It is based in an account of "pure rational thinking" (1) that construes thinking in a broadly Fregean way (5) that not only incorporates the notion of sense, but also emphasizes Fregean concerns about objectivity and intersubjective validity (9). Philosophical traditionalism is maybe a little untraditional in eschewing "experiential rationalism" (2), according to which the epistemology of philosophy makes essential use of intuitions, but this clears the ground for vindicating the book's "motivating concern" -- "philosophical anti-exceptionalism" (2) -- according to which philosophical inquiry employs only resources already available for use (and to a certain degree in use) in both scientific and quotidian thinking. The book's promise is to vindicate the objectivity and intersubjective validity of a traditional and anti-exceptional conception of philosophy.
The book grounds its lofty theoretical ambitions in numerous arguments, and in positive accounts of a number of related issues, including:
· a partial account of the nature of propositional attitudes and their psychological and social realization
· an account of the a priori
· a theory of the content and epistemology of thought experiments
· a study of modal knowledge as a case study for philosophical traditionalism
· an epistemological compare and contrast of perception and intuition
· criticism of the negative program of experimental philosophy.
It also engages directly with the views of a number of philosophers, both contemporary and from the history of analytic philosophy. Overall, it is an impressive tome (a rewarding, but not quick, 354-page read) that helps to crystallize a framework of ways of thinking and fundamental problems for the philosophy of philosophy. At its best, it provides comprehensive scaffolding for, as well as fresh insights into, the theory of content and epistemology of a sophisticated rationalist conception of philosophy.
The book's scope makes a comprehensive review impossible here. I focus on "arguably the heart of [the] project" (5) -- on the account of pure rational thinking -- and briefly discuss how some potential problems with that account pulse through the defence of philosophical traditionalism, philosophical anti-exceptionalism, and the critique of experiential rationalism.
Pure rational thinking
An account of "pure rational thinking" is at the foundation of the rationalist conception of philosophy Ichikawa and Jarvis defend. Pure rational thinking follows the "rules of thought" that are constitutive of what it is to have propositional attitudes/cognitive states in general. The account of pure rational thinking employs a complex ontology and theory of content. I critically discuss a number of issues concerning this ontology and theory in what follows.
The authors give a partial account of propositional attitudes. Propositional attitudes have a nature that is partially determined by their contents, which are propositions. Propositions are structured entities with concepts as constituents. Concepts are syntactic/semantic hybrids of mental representation together with their semantic values. The syntactic feature of a concept or proposition (the mental representation) is individuated in terms of its use or conceptual role, a use or conceptual role that is essentially, although not constitutively, tied to the semantic value of the concept or proposition (18-19). The semantic values of propositions are Fregean senses. The Fregean sense of a proposition (note the non-standard terminology) is "construed" in terms of rationality. According to the authors, their "view belongs to [the] Fregean tradition", a tradition that sees "deep ties between propositional contents and rationality" (22). On the authors' views, Fregean sense is identified with certain objective rational relations amongst propositions, what they call "conclusive rational relations" (22, 26) of rational entailment ("r-entailment") (47).
It is of fundamental importance for the authors that the r-entailment relations in terms of which they explain Fregean sense are objective, and that failures to "capitalize" (24) on or "harvest" (163) these relations in thinking are the result of rational limitations that are irrelevant for the nature of Fregean senses: "The rationally-conclusive-for relation is objective, in the sense that it does not depend on the rational limitations of a subject" (25). This leads to a highly objective account of Fregean senses which is paired with highly objective accounts of rationality, justification, and a priority, explained in terms of propositional rationality and justification ("p-rationality" and "p-justification"). The contrast here is with psychologized (including but not limited to doxastic) notions of rationality and justification ("rationalityex ante", "ψ-rationality", "d-justification"). p-rationality and p-justification are the more fundamental notions -- "most of the interesting action, for our purposes, concerns p-rationality, rather than rationalityex ante or ψ-rationality, although we will make use of both these other notions from time to time" (33).
One might, and the authors do, question the need for a distinction between Fregean senses and propositions:
Why make the distinction? The short answer is: Fregean senses tell us about rational commitments; propositions tell us about the wider array of different types of cognitive states -- including cognitive states that are irrational. (29)
A more rather than less complex ontology is no doubt appropriate for certain explanatory projects. But the authors explicitly include explaining irrational cognitive states as an example of the kind of explanatory project for which a theory of Fregean sense is insufficient and in need of supplementation. But aren't irrational cognitive states just cognitive states that ignore, flout, or somehow offend against the rules of thought? Why would a distinct notion of content be required in order to explain irrational cognitive states? There is a worry here that the authors' views do not reveal an explanatory limit for Fregean sense but instead reveal a limitation of their own particular account of Fregean sense.
What kinds of irrational cognitive states do we need to make sense of not only Fregean senses, but also propositions? According to the authors
Fregean sense tells us something . . . about p-rational commitments. . . . Propositions, on the other hand, tell us something about the range of possible content-laden cognitive states a subject might be in. There can be content-laden cognitive states that are distinct even though they carry the same p-rational commitments. . . (33)
Like which ones -- which content-laden cognitive states can be distinct but agree in p-rational commitments?
Proofs of equivalency can be surprising because they can show a subject that two psychological states turn out to carry, not only the same p-rational commitments, but ipso facto also the same information about the world even when the subject may not have been treating the two psychological states equivalently. . . (33)
Proofs of equivalency (for example, of mathematical equivalences and identities) are a priori but informative. The existence of such proofs shows that the relevant cognitive states involved in thinking through them have identical p-rational commitments. This implies that thinkers sometimes do not treat cognitive states that are p-rationally equivalent -- that have the same Fregean senses -- equivalently. Call this the problem of a priori cognitive significance. The authors' idea is that we need the distinction between propositions and Fregean senses to deal with the problem of a priori cognitive significance.
The authors are subject to the objection that their account identifies Fregean senses that should be distinguished. The ultimate basis of this objection is that their account takes too broad a range of rational relations to constitute Fregean senses. The alternative is to use a narrower range of rational relations in the constitution of Fregean sense (the rationally immediate or basic ones) and re-create the broader relations (the rationally mediate or derivative ones) from these.
Ichikawa and Jarvis say some things to try to deflect this criticism of the distinction (29-32). Their main response is to try to shift the burden of argument:
Thus, to argue against our identification of Fregean senses with all conclusive rational relationships, [one] need[s] to claim . . . that there is no sense in which, for instance, an ordinary human being who knows <Joe is a mailman> is thereby rationally committed to any proposition of the form <Joe is a mailman and p> where <p> is some complicated tautology. (31; original emphasis)
This is not right. The burden of argument is not to show that no idealized notion of rationality and rational commitment can be developed along the lines that they favour, but instead to show that even if some such notion can be developed, it will not be the fundamental normative notion in the theory of propositional attitudes. If, as on Frege's view, that theory is required to make sense of cognitive significance within the a priori, the authors' highly idealized notion will not be the fundamental normative notion in the theory of propositional attitudes. Since the authors' broader range of rational relations can be reconstructed from the more narrow range (cf. 29), it is clear that the more Fregean view need not reject the cogency of their authors'. To repeat, it only need say that it is not the fundamental normative notion in the theory of propositional attitudes.
I turn now to a distinct and deeper problem, one that remains even when the problem of a priori cognitive significance has been set aside. According to the authors, no matter how narrow a range of rational relations is used to constitute Fregean sense, a distinct notion of proposition will still be required to make sense of the irrational cognitive states that are involved in recognizing the obtaining of even the basic rational relations:
we see no particular reason to assume that what is "basic" has a psychological correlate in ordinary human subjects that is particularly robust. . . . Discovering what is "basic" requires significant cognitive sophistication. .
I think that the authors are correct to argue that one can be in error about even the most basic rational relations amongst propositions. That those rational relations obtain can then be informative. Call this the problem of analytic cognitive significance. The authors' idea is that we need the distinction between propositions and Fregean senses to deal with the problem of analytic cognitive significance.
It is easy to sympathize with them on this point. The problem of analytic cognitive significance is a tough one for the Fregean. Fregean senses are supposed to explain Frege puzzles, but if Frege puzzles can be run on senses, then it looks like senses are just not the kinds of things that cognitive significance requires. Frege's puzzle would be a puzzle for Fregeans and anti-Fregeans alike, with, it seems, no advantage gained by the appeal to senses. On the other hand, if one cannot run Frege puzzles on senses, then appearances that we can -- the problem of analytic cognitive significance -- needs to be explained away.
That is what the authors do. They explain it away as not involving genuine rational cognitive significance, but as involving a kind of cognitive significance for the irrational or rationally limited -- some kind of psychologized cognitive significance. Their distinction between propositions and Fregean sense in this way is part of their execution of a kind of error theory about the problem of analytic cognitive significance. Although I will be touching on related important issues as well, their treatment of the problem of analytic cognitive significance will be the overarching topic for the rest of this section.
On the authors' view, although even basic rational relations and the rules of thought may not be psychologically realized, they need not be for cognitive states to be typed by Fregean senses:
Of course, people don't stand in relation to the propositional objects we've characterized by straightforwardly being disposed to infer according to certain rules of inference, but having these dispositions is not required for following these rules in the relevant sense. (85)
What needs to be psychologically realized is something whose nature is explained in terms of the relevant rational relations. According to the authors, the nature of cognitive states that do not psychologically realize conclusive rational relations is partially explained in terms of those very conclusive rational relations. These cognitive states are cognitive states that by their very nature are such that their "second-order systematization" (86) does, in the ideal limit (88), psychologically realize the objective conclusive relations that hold amongst propositions.
It is important to be clear about the role second-order systematization plays in the authors' view. Second-order systematization plays a role in the authors' theory of content like the role that deference to a social practice plays in social externalism. In social externalism there is an explanatory burden to explain why cognitive states are typed as they are in various circumstances. The explanation is that the typing of the cognitive states is not determined by what is psychologically realized in the thinker, but by what is psychologically realized in the social practice to which the thinker defers. Second-order systematization, too, explains why cognitive states are typed as they are, but in cases where this typing is determined not by psychological realization in the thinker, nor by deference to the social practice, but instead by intellectual deference to the results of ideal second-order systematization. The authors describe this in terms of a distinction between ordinary mastery and extraordinary mastery:
Ordinary mastery of a concept is compatible with only very approximately adhering to the r-entailment rules tied to that concept. . . . extraordinary mastery of a concept does require a straightforward psychological implementation of the r-entailment rules tied to the concept in question. Extraordinary mastery of a concept is not required for non-deferential concept possession. (90)
They go on to explain how the "straightforward psychological implementation" of extraordinary mastery is to be achieved in terms of second-order systematization (91-93). The role of second-order systematization in the authors' theory of content is to explain how extraordinary mastery can determine the typing of cognitive states that involve ordinary (non-deferential) mastery.
What is the authors' account of the second-order systematization that figures here? The authors provide helpful description of the norms for second-order systematization, which include "explanatory power . . . relative resistance to revision, clear applicability in distant counterfactual circumstances, the relative simplicity or non-arbitrariness of a pattern of inference . . . a relative paucity of performance errors" (38; see also 82-83). However, the authors fail to address other questions, in particular about the nature of the cognitive states involved in second-order systematization.
These questions are important because they harbour a dilemma for the authors' views. Ichikawa and Jarvis can take seriously, or not, questions about the nature of the cognitive states involved in second-order systematization. Not taking the questions seriously leaves a lacuna in their account of the propositional attitudes and pure rational thinking. Taking the questions seriously significantly alters their account of pure rational thinking.
On the first horn, an account of the propositional attitudes presumably should not be restricted to first-order attitudes unless there is some compelling reason to do so. Given that the authors assign such a significant role to second-order systematization in their account of the nature of the propositional attitudes, it is compelling to think that their account should not be so restricted. Further, not taking seriously the cognitive states involved in second-order systematization produces a serious lacuna in the account of Fregean sense. For then, what is the explanation for why cognitive states that do not psychologically realize certain conclusive rational relations either individually or socially should nevertheless be typed in terms of those conclusive rational relations? Second-order should not be second-class, especially, on the authors' views.
Suppose then, on the second horn, that the authors were to take the cognitive states involved in second-order systematization seriously. Then we need an account of the propositional content and Fregean senses of these cognitive states. However, not only do the authors not provide such an account, to do so would be to significantly alter the account of pure rational thinking. This is because it then needs to be considered whether there are relations of rational significance between the second-order cognitive states involved in systematization and the first-order cognitive states that they are systematizations of. Given the authors' view that the rational relations amongst propositions are objective, the rational relations between second-order cognitive states and first-order cognitive states could be objective, too. Capitalizing on those relations could then be required for being p-rational. The relations between second-order and first-order cognitive states need not be relations of r-entailment, but they may nevertheless be rational relations in the sense of relating concepts in such a way so as to make possible the rational advance that the authors describe second-order systematization as making possible.
Ichikawa and Jarvis, in effect, take the first horn of the dilemma, for they do not articulate whether and which rational relations second-order cognitive states stand in to first-order cognitive states. On their view, the account of rational relations is flat -- the rational relations are relations amongst first-order cognitive states -- and not hierarchical -- rational relations do not hold between second-order and first-order states. The flat view though, fails to make sense of what should be a natural and plausible thought at this juncture: namely, that second-order systematization uses concepts with Fregean senses that are constituted by objective rational relations that hold between second-order and first-order cognitive states, objective rational relations that are capitalized on in competent second-order systematization.
One place at which the authors might have elaborated on hierarchical rational relations is in their account of the nature of conceptual analysis. On the envisioned hierarchical view, conceptual analysis would be a matter of second-order systematization of the rational commitments involved in the first-order use of concepts. But they abjure such an understanding of conceptual analysis. The authors write:
Conceptual analysis is not analysis of concepts . . . [it] is a method of analyzing the natures of objects, properties, and relations using principally the inferential competencies involved with complete conceptual mastery (rather than mere concept possession). . . . Conceptual analysis proceeds by deploying our inferential competencies and thereby competently using concepts, rather than thinking about them. . . . we primarily exhibit sensitivity to r-entailment relations; we don't think about those r-entailment relations. (228)
But this seems to be in rather direct tension with the role of second-order systematization. Presumably that does involve thinking about cognitive states and the concepts that they deploy, and about r-entailment relations -- that is what makes the systematizations second-order. The authors, however, could have said things that would have harmonized what they do say with the role of second-order systematization. For example, the authors could have said that conceptual analysis involves second-order thinking about concepts, but also requires using the concepts thought about. They could have said that using the concept being analyzed is a necessary but not sufficient condition of engaging in conceptual analysis. They could have said that we exhibit sensitivity to r-entailment relations by thinking about them in second-order systematization.
Finally, taking seriously the cognitive states involved in second-order systematization provides resources for responding to the problem of analytic cognitive significance in a way that need not deny that the problem is a genuine problem about cognitive significance. The problem that confronts this non-error-theoretic approach is that it makes it look as though senses are not the right kinds of things to solve problems about cognitive significance because they themselves are subject to the same problem. But the existence of senses of second-order concepts provides new resources with which to understand the problem of analytic cognitive significance. For in that case, there are two relevant senses at issue -- the senses of the second-order and first order concepts -- and maybe one of the senses can be subject to a problem of the kind it is intended to solve (the first-order sense) but only because it is the subject matter of a distinct sense that is not subject to that kind of problem (the second-order sense). And maybe the problem of analytic significance can be explained by a distinction in second-order senses in the usual Fregean way: one and the same first-order sense is being presented to second-order systematizing thinking in two distinct ways. My point here is not to advocate this view, but to point out how taking seriously the cognitive states involved in second-order systematization could lead to a more robust view of Fregean sense, one that does not explain away the problem of analytic cognitive significance and moreover confronts it with only Fregean resources.
I turn now briefly to consequences for philosophical traditionalism, the critique of experiential rationalism, and for philosophical anti-exceptionalism. My remarks here are more speculative and impressionistic. I include them mainly to inform/intrigue my readers about other ideas in the book.
Philosophical traditionalism, experiential rationalism, and philosophical anti-exceptionalism
Philosophical traditionalism can be sustained, but the rational relations that a priori inquiry capitalizes on will not be flat but hierarchical, and so will include relations that relate second-order and first-order thinking. This change arguably leads to a more traditional philosophical traditionalism, in which the reflective and systematic nature of philosophy is forefront. It also provides an alternative framework for thinking of the a priori.
The authors' views of the a priori are heavily conditioned by three key claims. The first is that a priority is a matter of the independence from experience of p-justification, not d-justification. The second is that experience comes in empiricist and (from the authors' point of view, pseudo-) rationalist varieties and that the a priori involves independence from both kinds of experience -- hence, the critique of experiential rationalism. The third is a robust and rationalist-friendly distinction between experience playing a merely enabling role and experience playing a warranting role -- rationalist-friendly because the authors' distinction is meant to give the category of merely enabling a broad reach (Chapter 6).
On the authors' view, philosophical knowledge counts as knowledge a priori because although it may involve experience in making use of intuitions, this experience plays at most an enabling role -- enabling a thinker psychologically to capitalize on objective rational relations -- and not a warranting role (299). On a view that allows hierarchical rational relations, however, things look differently. A defence of the view that philosophical knowledge is a priori need not eliminate some experiential rationalist threat. This is because a hierarchical view can have its own positive account of how at least certain kinds of philosophical knowledge -- achieved by second-order systematization -- can be a priori.
The envisioned account turns on the idea that the subject matter of second-order systematizing is thinking itself -- namely first-order thinking about the world. The fact that second-order thinking is thinking about thinking itself makes second-order systematization general or topic-neutral in an interesting way. Second-order systematization is not general or topic neutral in covering every, or having no particular, subject matter, but instead in having a subject matter, first-order thinking, which itself covers every, or has no particular, subject matter. This is an idea that the authors pick up on:
in contrast to first-order inferential competencies, the second-order inferential competencies in question are wholly general abilities. Unlike first-order inferential competencies, they are not topic-particular. (90; original emphasis)
They do not really connect this idea back up with the account of the a priori; but doing so undermines the need for the critique of experiential rationalism, as I will indicate.
The closest the authors come to connecting back up with the a priori is in their linking of second-order systematization with the ability to "theory-build"
the ability to theory-build is topic-neutral -- which is why a philosopher who honed this ability by working on the theory of causation as a novice can use it later to work on diachronic personal identity instead. Without developing such theories and making distinctions, inquiry can become confused because we have failed to fix what the object of inquiry is. This point is not restricted to philosophical inquiry; it is a feature of inquiry generally. (94)
The first part of what they say re-iterates topic-neutrality. The second part, though, intimates the idea that second-order systematization (or theory-building) makes the general epistemic contribution of clarifying confused inquiry by fixing content, whatever that content may be.
This idea can be harnessed to explain an alternative account of the a priori. According to this account, at least some philosophical knowledge is a priori in being grounded in general or topic-neutral second-order thinking that takes first-order thinking as its subject matter. Although this first-order thinking may itself be a priori or a posteriori justified, and so may cast experience in a warranting role (if a posteriori), this warranting role of experience in first-order belief is consistent with its merely enabling role in the distinctive epistemic contribution that second-order systematization makes (cf. the authors' argument against a Sellarsian account of conceptual analysis (85-86)). This view explains how philosophical knowledge can be a priori even if it makes essential use of intuitions. It can perfectly well allow that intuitions are amongst those first-order cognitive states second-order systematization takes as its subject matter, and indeed that intuitions have somehow acquired a favoured status and that they are uniquely those first-order cognitive states. Even if these intuitions are experiential, this does not make the knowledge that second-order systematization of those intuitions itself affords a posteriori.
What about the authors' critique of experiential rationalism? Their main argument against experiential rationalism is based, ultimately, on the idea that experiential rationalism compromises the intersubjective validity and objectivity of rational inquiry. The argument is good only if rational inquiry really is intersubjectively valid and objective in the way that the authors think it is. They understand the intersubjective validity and objectivity of rational inquiry to amount to an independence of the norms of rational inquiry from, respectively, particular psychological contingencies and psychological contingencies in general (10; see also 244-248). Let me leave aside here the thesis of objectivity and focus on what I will call the thesis of intersubjective validity. What is of particular interest is how and whether the demands of second-order systematization cohere with the thesis of intersubjective validity.
Suppose two scientists who are leading proponents of different theoretical approaches to some domain confront what they can identify as the same phenomenon. One explains the phenomenon in one way; the other explains it in another way. Suppose that the explanations not only differ, but also conflict with or exclude each other. Suppose further that the explanations are second-order systematized with the theoretical commitments of their respective approaches, and include compelling reasons for each scientist to think (from their respective second-order systematized perspectives) that the other approach is misguided.
It seems to me that both scientists are rational in proceeding in explanation as they do. I think that the authors would agree with me that there is a sense in which the scientists are rational, but the authors would also insist that there is another sense in which at least one of the two scientists is not rational -- at least one of the two scientists is out of accordance with the rules of thought governing thought about the phenomenon. I would agree with the authors about this, including about the existence of such objective rules of thought, but if we are to take second-order systematization seriously, we have to consider as well whether the two scientists are employing second-order inferential competencies that are out of accordance with the rules of thought governing not (or not only) thought about the relevant phenomena, but thought about thought about the relevant phenomena. And here, we might think that the scientists are not out of accordance with the rules of thought -- with the rules governing the concepts that figure in second-order systematization -- for each scientist is systematizing in a way that best systematizes their thinking (from their respective systematized perspectives) about the phenomenon at issue.
Ichikawa and Jarvis would say that the example speaks against the thesis of intersubjective validity only because it involves rational compromise, and under conditions of ideal rationality, intersubjective validity remains unscathed (cf. the discussion of "Quinean revisability", (75-77)). But what is special (or is supposed to be special) about the example is that although the scientists may manifest rational compromise, this rational compromise is itself backed by rational competence. That is, the example is supposed to be one according to which complying with one kind of norm (a norm of systematization) explains why one (or both) of the scientists fails to comply with other norms (norms based in rational relations). The failure at the first-order level is rationalized by the success at the second-order level.
The example indicates the presence of a more complex normative structure than the simple charge of rational compromise lets on. This more complex normative structure makes for a more complex view about intersubjective validity. It may even suggest a kind of perspectival nature for at least some of the norms of inquiry. More conservatively, the example suggests that the question for experiential rationalism is not whether it is consistent with the authors' thesis of intersubjective validity but whether it is consistent with the more complex view about intersubjective validity that arguably emerges from reflection on deep theoretical disagreement.
Finally, some remarks about the authors' defence of philosophical anti-exceptionalism. The view invites the following questions of relative priority: is philosophical inquiry unexceptional because it is like quotidian and scientific inquiry, or is it unexceptional because quotidian and scientific inquiry are like it? Is philosophy unexceptional because its resources are limited by quotidian and scientific inquiry or because quotidian and scientific inquiry partake of what are fundamentally but not exclusively philosophical resources?
The authors emphasize the role of second-order systematization in philosophy -- "second-order inferential competencies play a crucial role in facilitating knowledge in philosophy" (220). They do the same with quotidian and scientific inquiry -- "the story that we are telling about philosophical inquiry via thought-experiments is entirely akin to -- and occasionally even identical to -- stories that we want tell about inquiry more generally" (222) (although the examples that they describe (222-224) are not especially effective for making the point). This makes it look like the assimilation that they envision is of the quotidian and scientific into the philosophical. But on the official story, the concepts and Fregean senses at play in second-order systematization are irrelevant to the a priori status of philosophical knowledge because the relevant objective rational relations that define the a priori status of philosophical knowledge are flat and not hierarchical. This means that the epistemology of philosophy is not fundamentally reflective and systematic. And this, then, can look like an attempt to assimilate philosophical inquiry to a view of quotidian and scientific inquiry that itself is flat, in which we "primarily exhibit sensitivity to r-entailment relations, [and] don't think about those r-entailment relations" (228, quoted more fully above). But this is the wrong direction in which to assimilate. If second-order systematization were not treated as though it were second-class, then the other direction of assimilation would again look viable, with quotidian and scientific inquiry partaking in the fundamentally but not exclusively philosophical resource of second-order systematization.
I have emphasized criticism in this review, but I want to end by emphasizing my view that the book is a thorough, informative, often enlightening, and only rarely dissatisfying work on the philosophy of philosophy. The book does not contain the discoveries that will give the philosophy of philosophy peace, but it will surely provide an incitement to further discourse about the theory of content and epistemology of philosophy.
Many thanks to Mark Fortney, Gillian Russell, and Joshua Schechter for written comments on earlier drafts of this review.