The Russellian Origins of Analytical Philosophy: Bertrand Russell and the Unity of the Proposition

Placeholder book cover

Graham Stevens, The Russellian Origins of Analytical Philosophy: Bertrand Russell and the Unity of the Proposition, Routledge, 2005, 208pp, $115.00 (hbk), ISBN 0415360447.

Reviewed by Francisco Rodríguez-Consuegra, Valencia University


The subtitle, "Bertrand Russell and the unity of the proposition", might have been a better title for this brief, interesting book, since it is a survey of the stages in which Russell develops the problem of the unity of the proposition, and does not focus on the much wider subject of the origins of analytical philosophy in Russell's thought. The notion of analytical philosophy involves mostly a method of doing philosophy, and Russell devoted much effort to developing such an analytical method, an effort not dealt with in this book.

That said, let us concentrate on the main objectives of the book. It is explicitly devoted to demonstrating the unity of Russell's philosophy, which, Stevens maintains, lies in his ideas, throughout his career, about the nature of unities. In particular, Stevens believes that the unity of the proposition is a good focus for understanding the whole of Russell's development. In addition, he maintains that the problem is very important in itself, so that Russell's efforts to solve it deserve more attention than they have received. A remarkable trait of the book is that, unlike most treatments, it is not limited to Russell's philosophical development from 1903 (Principles of Mathematics) to 1918 ("The philosophy of logical atomism"). On the contrary, the last two of the six chapters are devoted to the later stages of Russell's philosophy, including Analysis of Mind (1921), An Inquiry into Meaning and Truth (1940) and Human Knowledge (1948). Finally, the author has taken into consideration many materials that have been published only recently in Russell's Collected Papers, and even a few manuscripts still unpublished.

In the following, I'll say something about the content of each of the chapters, most of which were previously published as separate papers. Also, I will occasionally add critical comments concerning the ideas and arguments. At the end, I'll offer an overall judgment on the importance and originality of the book.

After a useful introduction, we find the first chapter, "Russell, Frege, and the analysis of unities". This is a very ambitious chapter, since it is supposed to describe Russell's development from his rebellion against neo-Hegelianism (1898) to the publication of Principles (1903). The author considers the development of Russell's logicism under the influences of Bradley, Cantor, Weierstrass, Dedekind, Frege, Moore, and Peano -- all in just nineteen pages. Russell's ontology of things and concepts (two quite different items) is shown to be the basis of his account of the unity of the proposition, since, contrary to Frege, concepts are admitted as both capable of acting as logical subjects and as true conceptual entities. It is not, however, totally clear how the twofold nature of concepts might provide an explanation of the unity of the proposition. Moreover, since many of the points dealt with in the chapter could easily be the subjects of separate chapters or even books (as the existing monumental bibliography shows), I take this chapter to be a simple extension of the introduction. Even so, I was disappointed to see no treatment of Russell's interesting efforts to solve the problem of the unity of complexes or of his discussions of the nature of analysis in his various attempts, prior to Principles, to develop a "logicist" approach to mathematics, particularly since the relevant materials are easily available in the Collected Papers and have even been discussed in some current literature.

The next chapter covers, roughly, the period from Principles to Principia (1910). It contains brief presentations of Russell's most important stages prior to Principia, i.e., the discovery of the famous paradox, the theory of descriptions, the substitutional theory, and the theory of types (simple and ramified). According to Stevens, these stages are linked as follows: the theory of descriptions provided a method that was later applied to dispense with classes, through the substitutional theory; then the latter was abandoned in favor of the theory of types; and all of this led Russell to a retreat from Pythagoras, i.e., to an enormous simplification of his former ontology of classes, relations, numbers, etc. Stevens' presentations of the different stages are clear and useful, and he is correct to emphasize the importance of the theory of descriptions as inspiring a useful method of dispensing with Russell's earlier ontological exuberance. However, the links among these theories are much more sophisticated than Stevens suggests; for instance, there was no need of any substitutional theory in order to arrive at a no-classes theory. Moreover, the theory of descriptions showed Russell the difference between apparent entities and genuine entities, leading him to a new, general analytical method of conceptual analysis, and so to a viewpoint according to which some apparent constituents of complexes are not true constituents. This would serve as a clear inspiration for the new multiple-relation theory of judgment even before the abandonment of the substitutional theory. Also, Stevens makes no attempt to consider the mass of unpublished manuscripts Russell wrote between Principles and "On Denoting", which have all been published years ago. Those manuscripts are very useful for understanding the complex links between Russell's development and Frege's semantics, and include some explicit attempts to accept that semantics.

The next chapter, "Ramification and Principia Mathematica", seems to me one of the most substantial of the book and contains useful references and quotations from unpublished manuscripts. Stevens begins by following Landini in describing Russell's abandonment of the substitutional theory as due to a paradox, internal to that theory, that Russell discovered in 1906 and was never able to overcome. Also, Stevens follows Landini in maintaining that the substitutional theory is a fundamental element in the theory of types that Russell published in 1908, although the only evidence we are given is the assertion by Russell that ramified functions "may be obtained" from ramified propositions by substitution (p. 62). It is difficult to understand that Russell kept the substitutional theory as an essential element of the 1908 theory of types when he knew that the former had been destroyed by an insurmountable contradiction. Moreover, substitution involved an ontology of propositions, as the author clearly admits (p. 63), but the status of propositions in 1908 is so obscure that Russell does not admit them as primitive ideas (as they were in Principia, even as incomplete symbols). So it is reasonable to wonder whether by that time Russell had already renounced propositions as entities, which is incompatible with substitution. His 1908 paper was no place to do philosophy, so it is understandable that Russell did not mention a new no-propositions ontology. As we shall see below, this is compatible with the claim, which can be defended with abundant textual evidence, that Russell accepted a multiple-relation theory of judgment already in 1908, and even before.

The chapter continues by linking the substitutional paradox to Cantor's diagonal procedures and discussing, and rejecting, through careful and detailed arguments, Landini's attribution to Russell of a clear awareness of a distinction between the Cantorian paradoxes and the semantic paradoxes. Here the author seems to me quite convincing. His final arguments that Principia cannot be regarded as a nominalistic work, despite its rejection of propositions as entities, mostly due to Russell's ontology of universals, are also convincing. Finally, there is a discussion of the role of functions in Principia, through which Stevens offers a linguistic interpretation of functions, although he again maintains that there is an important ontological difference with the 1908 paper. This seems reasonable in view of the fact that Russell introduced propositional functions through propositions, which he did not, at that time, recognize as true entities. However, the repeated assertion that the rejection of propositions as entities was due to the appearance of the multiple-relation theory of judgment only in Principia, but not in 1908, seems to me unconvincing, for the reason I mentioned in the preceding paragraph. Despite these criticisms, the chapter is important as a whole; the arguments are clear and the objectives proposed are covered with ease.

The fourth chapter, entirely devoted to the rise and fall of the multiple-relation theory of judgment, is also important, but much shorter than the preceding chapter, despite its being very ambitious in scope. It contains brief expositions of (i) Russell's multiple-relation theory of judgment as it appeared in Principia and in the never finished book Theory of Knowledge (1913), (ii) the Sommerville-Griffin interpretation of Wittgenstein's criticism of the new theory of judgment, and (iii) Russell's own comments after 1913. These are all well known subjects, much discussed in the literature. The originality of the chapter rests on the author's arguments against the Sommerville-Griffin interpretation and his defense of the claim that Russell's comments against the new theory of judgment contain his true reasons for rejecting the theory. Very briefly, Stevens argues that the the types needed in the theory of types do not depend on the generation of orders supplied by the hierarchy of judgments in the multiple-relation theory, so they could survive this interpretation of Wittgenstein's criticisms, which were directed rather against Russell's conception of logic and his division of propositional content into parts within a true unity. This is why the author believes the devastating character of these criticisms must lie elsewhere, i.e., in Russell's own reasons. Yet the reasons alleged by Russell are very briefly explained and can be summarized by saying that for him verbs can occur just as verbs, not as separate, independent entities, as is supposed in the multiple-relation theory, where verbs (i.e., relations) are treated on a par with the rest of the components of the proposition.

I sympathize with the author's general spirit in this chapter; however, I must point out at least two problems. First, there is no historical effort to reconstruct the actual appearance of the multiple-relation theory of judgment in Russell's writings, despite the chapter title's reference to the rise and fall of the theory. The author seems to share the received view that the theory just appeared in 1910. As I pointed out above, there is much evidence in earlier writings, published and unpublished, that the theory was known to Russell at least from 1906, if not before. Besides, in several still unpublished manuscripts Russell actually defends the theory, clearly before the 1908 theory of types, so it must underlie that theory. Second, although I agree that the Sommerville-Griffin interpretation should be corrected and inserted into a more general framework, I believe that Russell's comments need to be more clearly discussed and interpreted. In my view, when Russell rejects the multiple-relation theory of judgment based on the function of the verb (the relation) as verb, he was thinking of the relational nature of the form, an entity which the theory claims is needed to "glue" the rest of the components taken into consideration by our judging mind. Thus, the form cannot be made a new component of the complex, unless we are ready to fall into a form of Bradley's paradox concerning relations regarded as independent entities. Since I have developed these arguments in detail in three recent publications, I must limit myself to referring the interested reader to them.1

The two last chapters of the book are very different from the earlier ones, since they deal with the last stage of Russell's development, from 1919 to 1948, a stage much less studied by Russell scholars, probably under the assumption that Russell's achievements here are minor in comparison to his previous work. Chapter 5 examines the new theory of propositions, appearing in 1919-1921, according to which propositions are complex mental images, so that the unity of the proposition is achieved by the fact that in an image-proposition the formerly conflicting relation is now represented by another relation, an image-relation, and no longer by a term designating a relation. Thus, the unity of the proposition is achieved in a totally different, subjective manner. The new theory is, moreover, convenient since false propositions do not need to correspond to anything, so they proceed just from false mental representations. However, this theory gives rise to a new problem: within a correspondence theory of truth negative truth should also be based on something, so a discussion of the possibility of existing negative facts is needed. Thus, the last chapter is devoted to analyzing Russell's arguments in the 1940's for rejecting negative facts, which Stevens compares to his earlier positive arguments in the period of logical atomism. Here he analyzes what Russell's two last works, An Inquiry into Meaning and Truth, and Human Knowledge, had to offer as a correspondence theory dispensing with negative facts as well as general facts, taking into consideration some publications that have only recently appeared. As a whole, these two chapters are mostly expository, so their interest depends on the intrinsic interest of Russell's arguments, which seems to me rather low. Thus, though Stevens' attempt to study these rather dated theories is to be praised, the actual results for a possible revival of their kernel ideas are questionable.

A final, global judgment on this book is difficult, since the work is uneven. The two first chapters are mostly expository, and perhaps too ambitious, given the many different theories that are examined in a very small number of pages. The next two chapters seem to me to be the kernel of the book, since they explain and discuss very important, classical matters for the Russell scholar, and do so in a critical way, both for Russell and for a good part of the secondary literature. Yet the two last chapters return to a mostly expository mode and deal with parts of Russell's philosophy that are today clearly dated. From this standpoint, the problem with the book is its lack of unity, which may have something to do with the fact that most of the materials have been previously published as separate papers. For the Russell scholar a reading of the two central chapters and a light look at the last two would probably be enough. The general reader interested in Russell's philosophical development will find the book useful as a whole, since it is written in a clear, attractive style, but its most original parts will go beyond the general comprehension, so it will not easily compete with other introductory books on Russell. Summing up: both the Russell scholar and the general reader will find interesting materials in this book, but neither will find it uniformly useful.

1 "Wittgenstein and Russell on propositions and forms". In J. Padilla Gálvez (ed.), Wittgenstein from a new point of view. Frankfurt a.M., New York et al.: Peter Lang, 2003, pp. 79-110. "Propositional ontology and logical atomism". In Godehard Link (ed.), One Hundred Years of Russell's Paradox. Berlin: de Gruyter, 2004, pp. 417-434. "Russell on judgment, truth and denoting, 1900-1910". In G. Imaguire and B. Linsky (eds.), On denoting 1905-2005. Munich: Philosophia Verlag, 2005, pp. 251-284.