The Science of Knowing: J. G. Fichte's 1804 Lectures on the Wissenschaftslehre

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J.G. Fichte, The Science of Knowing: J. G. Fichte's 1804 Lectures on the Wissenschaftslehre, translated with an introduction and notes by Walter E. Wright, State University of New York Press, 2005, 260pp, $24.95 (pbk), ISBN 0791464504.

Reviewed by Matthew C. Altman, Central Washington University


Traditionally, Fichte has been interpreted philosophically as a wayward Kantian and historically as a mere stepping stone in the development of speculative idealism. But Fichte has recently begun to emerge from the long shadows of Kant and Hegel, and he is now considered by many to be a figure worthy of attention in his own right. Over the last thirty years, English-language scholarship on Fichte has significantly increased. Fichte's conception of philosophical thinking as an activity that validates idealism, his insistence on the need for systematicity and an absolutely certain foundation for transcendental philosophy, his understanding of how theoretical and practical reasoning are related, and especially his sophisticated approach to consciousness, which recognizes both rational and irrational elements in the formation of the subject, all provide important contributions to epistemology, philosophy of mind, and ethics, among other areas. Fichte is also thought to have anticipated a number of prominent themes in post-Nietzschean Continental philosophy, especially the idea that the "summons" (Aufforderung) of the other makes possible my existence as a subject.

Although Fichte's philosophy has begun to get the close attention it deserves, most scholars have focused on his early writings, before the so-called "Atheism Controversy" and his dismissal from the University of Jena in 1799. After his subsequent move to Berlin, Fichte taught privately and republished earlier works in order to make a living. But he also continued to reformulate his philosophy in a way that would answer his many critics and more effectively communicate it to an uncomprehending public. Fichte eventually devised what he considered a clearer and more convincing expression of the views that had been so widely misunderstood, and in 1804 he advertised a series of lectures that, for a fee, members of the public could attend. The second of three sets of lectures given during that year is viewed by many Fichte scholars as the first definitive account of the later Wissenschaftslehre.

The lectures of 1804 are opaque even by Fichte's standards, but Walter E. Wright does a masterful job of untangling his difficult prose. He breaks up Fichte's characteristically long sentences when necessary, captures the spirit of his neologisms, inserts additional words and adjusts punctuation to clarify a sentence's meaning, and includes some endnotes to explain various abbreviations and diagrams. Wright also includes a detailed index; a German-English glossary of important terms, along with short explanations of some of the more difficult ones; an appendix containing a letter and a series of aphorisms in which Fichte clearly spells out the conception of philosophy that informs the lectures; and an introduction that situates the lectures historically, explains Wright's approach to translation, and outlines a few of Fichte's key concepts, such as his reference to a "five-fold synthesis," which Wright considers to be integral to the entire book.

The difficulty of the text will probably leave readers hoping for more explanatory notes or a more detailed introduction. The sheer number of Fichte's technical terms seems to demand additional guidance, perhaps even an expanded glossary that defines them more thoroughly. But a translator can only do so much. Wright's excellent translation should pave the way for Anglo-American critics to confront the Wissenschaftslehre of 1804 with the energy that they have recently devoted to the earlier writings. And there is a wealth of material to cover here: Are these lectures a continuation of or a break from the line of thought developed during the Jena period? Are the differences merely a matter of emphasis and terminology, or something more significant? How should we situate Fichte in the development of German idealism, and in the history of philosophy more generally?

Fichte thought that the Jena writings did not express his ideas clearly enough. But he claims never to have abandoned his original positions; for him, the earlier and later formulations of the Wissenschaftslehre were perfectly compatible. Anglo-American scholars can now assess this claim and track Fichte's philosophical development over the course of his career. There are many themes that the 1804 lectures merely extend: for example, the performative nature of philosophical reflection; the need for a first principle to systematize the critical philosophy; and the distinction between the ordinary standpoint, in which objects confront us as independently existing things, and the standpoint of philosophy, in which those things are derived from a unitary ground. Early on Fichte tried to systematize Kant's transcendental idealism, to overcome Kant's dualisms (between reason and the understanding, freedom and necessity, practical and theoretical reason), to give a unified account of the human mind, and thus to establish a science of knowing. He continues these efforts in 1804, only with a different vocabulary. And, like the Grundlage der gesamten Wissenschaftslehre of 1794, the lectures are roughly divided into two parts: first, discovering a unitary principle that grounds multiplicity, and then explaining the distinctions that arise out of this unitary ground.

In his earlier work, Fichte replaces Reinhold's representing subject as a known fact (Tatsache) of theoretical consciousness with the I's act (Tathandlung) of determining itself as an I. To many readers, this seems to privilege the I as it posits itself in opposition to the not-I; Fichte at least gives the impression that the subject is wholly responsible for positing the object through the act of thinking. By 1804, however, Fichte had to defend himself against charges of atheism and claims by Schelling, Hegel, and others that the one-sided subjectivism of the Wissenschaftslehre must be overcome through a higher standpoint. Fichte's new emphasis on "oneness" is meant to blunt these criticisms. In 1804, Fichte gives up talk of positing the not-I and refuses to identify the I with the absolute. Instead, "I" or "We" and the objects of experience are both derived from oneness, which Fichte usually calls "the light." Fichte chooses this image carefully. Light is not an object per se -- it does not (apparently) take up space, although it is perceived as given -- but light exists (in some sense) by being seen, by our being affected by it. Talk of the light is meant to have us grasp something that is at once objective and subjective, immediately being and consciousness. This is a higher idealism that privileges neither our inner conceptual life (idealism) nor the content of our thinking as it seems to be given by a thing-in-itself (realism), but asserts the mutual dependence of being and thinking in the absolute.

In many ways, Fichte spent his whole career exploring the implications of Kant's doctrine of apperception. Self-consciousness as a condition of objectivity seems to imply the epistemic interdependence of spontaneity and materiality. Although Fichte always remained firmly rooted in Kant, by 1804 some of his thoughts on how the subject and object are related sound very Hegelian. Fichte's explanation of the higher idealism that emerges out of tensions in realism and idealism is particularly reminiscent of Hegel's dialectic. According to Fichte, realism abstracts from thinking and identifies the content of knowing as the only truth. However, the thing-in-itself, or mind-independent substance, would, taken alone, deny the possibility of thinking. In other words, materialism precludes the spontaneity necessary for constructing objects in consciousness. That leads to a contradiction: an in-itself is conceived as something of which we cannot be conscious, so it can only be understood in terms of and distinguished from consciousness. In the Jena Wissenschaftslehre, Fichte explains it in a similar way: we must posit such a thing in opposition to thinking, so there is no thing-in-itself per se, which would have to be a thing existing apart from consciousness. Being presupposes a consciousness against which it stands, so realism gives way to idealism.

Under the standpoint of idealism, the I actively constructs the real, which is merely a function of thinking. However, the subject can be defined only in opposition to others ("We") and to the world as it is given to a particular consciousness -- hence the need for what Fichte calls a "check" (Anstoss) in the Grundlage of 1794 and a "summons" in the Grundlage des Naturrechts (1796) and the Wissenschaftslehre nova methodo (1796/99). The object presupposes a consciousness by which it is thought, and the I presupposes a world that it is conscious of and against which it sets itself as a subject. Thus, neither the subject nor the object is primary. Both must be advanced under a higher form of idealism as complementary aspects of absolute being.

Like Hegel's Geist, Fichte's absolute is sometimes identified as a Spinozistic substance of which all other things are merely manifestations. However, Fichte takes great pains to deny that the living oneness is just some thing; that would require a corresponding consciousness and a higher synthesis between the two. The immediate awareness of our own activity -- what Kant calls apperception or self-consciousness, and Fichte calls self-positing (in Jena) or insight (in 1804) -- falsifies such an account. Fichte puts it this way: Substance is without life. Being is opposed to consciousness, so consciousness cannot be made possible by being. Kant already distinguished spontaneity from the givenness of sensible intuitions, and showed the necessity of the former for objects to be possible at all. What he failed to show, according to Fichte, was how oneness or the light forms the basis of both (subjective) thinking and (objective) being. Neither of these derivative terms can constitute the absolute, or an even higher synthesis would be necessary.

Fichte struggles with a language that always threatens to kill this key insight. What is fundamental to subject-object relations is the activity of relating the two through thinking. The purpose of philosophy is to expose what it means to think or to know or to live (what we do, expressed as verbs), not to explain thought or knowledge or life (things, expressed as nouns). Foreshadowing a concern that will become most prominent in the twentieth century, Fichte continuously contorts the language to try to state what cannot be stated, but only gestured at and expressed in the activity of thinking. That is why he repeatedly rephrases important ideas and develops parallel arguments that arrive at the same conclusion. For example, he calls the unitary ground the One, the absolute, light, living, reason, or God, depending on the context. Throughout his work, Fichte stresses that philosophy per se cannot be taught. It is something each of us must do. When we engage in such thinking, Fichte claims, his fundamental insight into living as the singular basis of subject and object is validated. Fichte is not explaining his position so much as prompting us to arrive at the same conclusions.

The Wissenschaftslehre should not be confused with a metaphysics, then, but some of its basic assumptions are questionable for different reasons. Among other things, Fichte's philosophy depends on accepting the claim that a systematic account of reality is necessary, one that would explain consciousness, nature, morality, politics, and religion. Toward the end of the lectures, he insists that all of these are merely different standpoints regarding subject-object relations. Although any philosophical position has implications in many other areas, philosophers have long since abandoned the idea that such a system is necessary, or even possible.

That is not to deny Fichte's firm grasp of the spirit of transcendental philosophy. Kant explained that neither empiricism nor rationalism could adequately account for experience. And many recent Anglo-American interpretations of Hegel have given up on the idea that Geist is some thing that manifests itself historically in different limited forms of consciousness. Instead, the Phenomenology of Spirit is attempting to get at what it means to be a minded being, and how our socially and historically infused reasoning tries unsuccessfully to relate the knowing subject and the known object. Fichte's refutations of idealism and realism serve a similar function.

Unfortunately, these lectures are so tinged with the influence of Schelling, Hegel, and even Spinoza that the Wissenschaftslehre of 1804 often looks less like transcendental philosophy than a version of absolute idealism, a throwback to the kind of metaphysical speculation that Kant had undermined. This may be a matter of how Fichte expresses himself, but it is nonetheless up to contemporary philosophers to rediscover his Kantian roots. For this purpose, the Jena writings are much more important, which is to say that they, not Fichte's later work, are more philosophically relevant when it comes to understanding the source of normativity in objective judgments. Historically the lectures of 1804 are invaluable for understanding the Wissenschaftslehre as a whole and relating Fichte to the history of German idealism. But philosophically the book fails in a number of ways: exploring the structure and laws that govern "the light" is less justifiable than a transcendental inquiry into the subjective conditions for the possibility of experience; his refutations of idealism and realism do little to establish the truth of a higher idealism, which in the early works results from what he calls our intellectual intuition of freedom; and he jettisons both the check and the summons, or the nonrational other that makes subjectivity possible -- which some scholars believe is his most important contribution to the theory of subjectivity. A case can made that all of these elements remain even in the lectures of 1804 -- indeed, Wright refers to all of these things in his introduction -- but they are much clearer in the Jena Wissenschaftslehre. To my mind, Fichte is a more original and important thinker when he extends Kant instead of emulating Hegel.