The Science of Logic

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Georg Wilhelm Friedrich Hegel, The Science of Logic, George di Giovanni (ed., tr.), Cambridge University Press, 2010, 790pp., $180.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521832557.

Reviewed by Timothy Brownlee, Xavier University, Cincinnati


The Science of Logic, Hegel’s second major work, is a notoriously difficult book. Hegel’s prose is dense, and his subject matter is onerous. At the same time, Hegel understands his project in the Logic to be a significant one. Tracing the development of a series of concepts out of “thinking” itself, the Logic is supposed to provide the core of ontology and, in some sense, to mark a renewal of metaphysics after Kant. In this new English translation of Hegel’s Science of Logic, George di Giovanni has produced a readable and scholarly edition of Hegel’s text that should replace A. V. Miller’s translation as the standard one.

This volume is the second in Cambridge University Press’s new “Cambridge Hegel Translations” series, under the general editorship of Michael Baur. (The third, a new translation of the Encyclopedia Logic, has since appeared.) Di Giovanni’s edition and translation set a high standard for future volumes. He augments his translation with extensive introductory and supplementary materials. He helpfully documents the history of the publication of the Logic and traces the development of Hegel’s thinking about logic and its relation to metaphysics in the Jena writings of the first decade of the nineteenth century. He situates his own interpretation of the Logic in relation to Hegel’s idealist predecessors, stressing in particular its relation to the work of Kant and Fichte. He also provides a summary account of the development of the argument of the text itself and relates this account to other prominent interpretations of the text, both historical and contemporary.

The Science of Logic (Die Wissenschaft der Logik, sometimes called the “greater ”“>Logic”) was published in the decade after the Phenomenology of Spirit (1807). The work appeared in two volumes. The first volume, containing the “Objective Logic,” was published in two parts, the first in 1812, and the second with the subtitle “The Doctrine of Essence” in 1813. The second volume, containing the “Subjective Logic,” consisting of “The Doctrine of the Concept” was published in 1816. It is a long work, and Hegel published an abbreviated version (the “lesser ”“>Logic”) as the first part of his Encyclopedia of Philosophical Science (1817, rev. 1827, 1830). Moreover, Hegel began significant revisions of the Science of Logic in his last years, submitting a revised version of the first part of the first volume, now with the subtitle “The Doctrine of Being,” to his publisher in January of 1831, some ten months prior to his death that year.

The Logic‘s subject matter is “”“>thinking or more specifically ”“>conceptual thinking.” (23) Hegel claims that we find “forms of thought … set out and stored in ”“>human language,” and the task of the logic is to articulate those intelligible “categories” presupposed by and at work in the use of language. (12) However, for Hegel, the subject matter of logic is, in an important sense, broader than that which he found in the textbooks of his predecessors. While Hegel’s logic too includes discussions of some standard subject matters — concepts, judgments, rules of inference — he criticizes those conceptions of logic according to which it is a merely formal science, setting out “rules for thinking.” For Hegel, logic has its own proper content, and that content is not merely “subjective” in nature. Rather, Hegel approaches the concepts and thought determinations which he sets out in the Logic as having objective content, that is, as the concepts in terms of which any object at all could become intelligible for us: logical forms “are not mere forms of self-conscious thinking but also of objective understanding.” (30) His general aim, therefore, is to set out those concepts which constitute necessary conditions for objective cognition.

The specific course which the logic follows derives from Hegel’s dialectical and speculative conception of thinking and its conceptual determinations. This conception of thinking has two main components: first, Hegel contends that “negativity” is inherent to thought determinations themselves, so that concepts only become intelligible to us when we grasp their negative relation to their opposite and contradictory concept. Thus, all thinking is necessarily dialectical. (35) The second basic component of Hegel’s conception of thinking depends on his idea of speculation, according to which the primary task of philosophical thinking is to grasp opposites and contradictions in their unity. To this end, Hegel draws again on the idea of determinate negation which animates the earlier Phenomenology of Spirit:

The one thing needed to achieve scientific progress … is the recognition of the logical principle that negation is equally positive, or that what is self-contradictory does not resolve itself into a nullity, into abstract nothingness, but essentially only into the negation of its particular content; or that such a negation is not just negation, but is the negation of the determined fact which is resolved, and is therefore determinate negation … Because the result, the negation, is a determinate negation, it has a content. It is a new concept but one higher and richer than the preceding. (33)

The logic simply follows the development of the negativity inherent to the thought determinations themselves, and its work consists in grasping those negative developments as speculative unities.

Di Giovanni understands the text’s subject matter in linguistic terms. He takes Hegel to be committed to the view that:

the truth of an object (Gegenstand) is only to be found in the discourse about it, so that any opaqueness as to what the object is, or whether it is at all, must be resolved from within the original discourse itself by developing it according to rules internal to it. There is no exit from language. This is the central point of Hegel’s position and the meaning of his repeated claim that the content of discourse is generated by its form. (xxxiv)

On this account, Hegel’s task in the logic is a transcendental one. By articulating the essential elements of “discourse itself,” beginning from “the least that one can say about an object in general while still making sense,” di Giovanni claims “one can proceed to identify sets of predicates, namely the categories, each of which defines the limits of a type of discourse suited to a certain subject matter.” (xxxv) The logic develops from the articulation of more abstract modes of intelligibility to increasingly concrete ones.

Hegel’s well-known starting point in the logic is, in a sense, the most abstract concept of all, the thought of “being.” He argues that being, which consists in “the indeterminate immediate,” contains no determinate content and is, as such, indistinguishable from “nothing”: “Nothing is therefore the same determination, or rather absence of determination, and thus altogether the same as what pure ”“>being is.” (59) Even the apparently simple thought of being, for Hegel, contains the negative in it — it is indistinguishable from its opposite, nothing — a fact which dialectic traces. However, Hegel contends that the task of speculation is to grasp these two determinations, being and nothing, as “moments” of a unity:

The truth is … that being has passed over into nothing and nothing into being … Their truth is therefore this movement of the immediate vanishing of the one into the other: becoming, a movement in which the two are distinguished, but by a distinction which has just as immediately dissolved itself. (59-60)

Hegel contends that this speculative unity of becoming can itself be taken as an immediate unity, which he suggests is “existence.” (81) For Hegel, the task of the logic is simply to track this development inherent to the thought forms through which objects become intelligible to us.

In the “doctrine of being,” the first section of the “objective logic,” he sets out those conceptual determinations — those of quality, quantity, and measure — by means of which we grasp objects “immediately,” that is, seemingly without the aid of complex concepts. By contrast, the second part of the objective logic, the “doctrine of essence,” acknowledges the necessary movement of negation inherent in being itself, and the task of the logic of essence is to make this negativity itself intelligible as a form of reflection. (339) The attempt to distinguish the essence of objects from what is unessential in them in terms of determinations of reflection -- like those of ground and grounded, whole and part, and cause and effect -- culminates in a conception of an essential relation of “substantiality” as the ultimate “unity of being and reflection.” (490) The final major development of the logic, however, is to show that this essential substance is itself no different from the thought determination which Hegel calls “the concept,” the subject matter of the second volume of the Logic, the “subjective logic.” That is, Hegel’s final move is a turn to examining those thought determinations in terms of which objects can be made intelligible for us at all as concepts, and that involves demonstrating that the negativity within being which appeared to be the work of an external and objective essence is in fact inherent to thinking itself and its determinate forms. The subjective logic demonstrates that objectivity can be reconstructed and made intelligible in explicitly conceptual terms.

Hegel is confident that the results of this approach are significant. In particular, unlike Kant, he claims that logic can be a science of truth independent of the contribution of sensible intuition, and he does not hesitate to insist that this “science of logic” as “pure speculative philosophy” constitutes “metaphysics proper” (9):

Logic is to be understood as the system of pure reason, as the realm of pure thought. This realm is truth unveiled, truth as it is in and for itself. It can therefore be said that this content is the exposition of God as he is in his eternal essence before the creation of nature and of a finite sprit. (29)

Likewise, Hegel praises “the older metaphysics” for identifying “that thinking in its immanent determinations, and the true nature of things, are one and the same content.” (25) In short, Hegel seems to overstep precisely the limitations on metaphysics which Kant aimed to secure through philosophical critique. Indeed, the status of Hegel’s claims concerning the metaphysical character of the logic have been an object of significant interpretive disagreement. Some understand Hegel’s logic to mark a return to an ancient understanding of speculative metaphysics or to a pre-critical rationalist monism; others offer various non-metaphysical accounts of Hegel’s project as a “category theory”; and still others stress the continuity of Hegel’s project in the logic with Kant’s critical philosophy.1

Di Giovanni ably sifts through and considers these predominant interpretive trends in his introduction. Moreover, he provides his own account of the relation between the logic and metaphysics. Specifically, he argues that the Logic does contribute to metaphysics, but in a decidedly post-Kantian sense. That is, in articulating the conceptual conditions for the intelligibility of any object of intellectual apprehension, the Logic does make “an ontological commitment, namely that being is in becoming.” However, “it makes it transcendentally … by demonstrating that, unless so conceived — unless ‘being’ holds an internal difference by virtue of which a discursive account of it can be construed — it could not be the object of intelligent apprehension.” (liii) The Logic retains the “transcendental” character that Kant argued is essential for the critical philosophy, insofar as it begins from and remains within this domain of the conditions for the intelligibility of any object at all. The logic therefore does not naively assume that what is true of the concept applies simply to what is true of the domains of nature and spirit. It merely articulates the discursive conditions under which those domains could be made intelligible and discovered at all: “There is never an exit from either the logically formal or the theoretical.” (xxxv)

Given the attention that Hegel devotes to situating his own logic in relation to Kant’s critical philosophy, di Giovanni’s account has much to recommend it. On the one hand, Hegel stresses significant continuity between his own project and Kant’s. He claims that his “objective logic” takes the place of Kant’s “transcendental logic,” and he praises Kant for identifying that concepts are not mere subjective forms, but rather necessary conditions for objective cognition. (40) In the introduction to the subjective logic, Hegel too praises Kant for identifying the unity of self-consciousness, the “I think” of transcendental apperception, as the ultimate source of the unity of objective concepts. (515) Hence, there is an important sense in which the subjective logic, the doctrine of the concept, takes as its point of departure Kant’s insight that objectivity presupposes concepts and that such “”“>conceptual comprehension of a subject matter consists in nothing else than in the ‘I’ making it ”“>its own, in pervading it and bringing it into ”“>its own form.” (516)

On the other hand, Hegel insists that, in some essential ways, Kant’s critical project is not critical enough. Hegel rejects Kant’s view that the truth necessarily depends on the contribution of sensible intuition. Rather, he claims that the first and necessary condition for engaging in philosophy is to move beyond regarding the mere givenness of intuition as real and true, “in contrast to what is thought and the concept.” (518) Likewise, Hegel rejects Kant’s metaphysical deduction of the categories from the table of judgments, which Kant draws uncritically from “ordinary logic.” (27, 525) Rather, he stresses the need to provide an immanent deduction of objective concepts by showing that they too are animated by the negativity inherent to all thinking. Because of its commitment to demonstrating the necessary emergence of those concepts from one another, a development internal to thought itself, Hegel stresses that his logic and the ontology founded on it are critical: unlike the “older metaphysics,” which derived its objects, “the soul, the world, and God” from the imagination, Hegel stresses that his ontology considers those thought determinations as they are in themselves, that is, dialectically. (42) In short, Hegel’s critique of Kant stresses that Kant’s approach was not sufficiently critical, accepting as given both the content of sensible intuition in cognition and the categories as derived from the functions of judgment.

Di Giovanni deserves praise for his translation of the text of the Logic itself. He bases his translation on the German Gesammelte Werke edition of Hegel’s text, including marginal references to the volume and page of that standard edition. His translation of the logic of being is drawn from the extensive revision of the first part of the work that Hegel submitted for publication shortly before his death, and he includes some helpful notes on the extent and significance of the changes that Hegel made in that later addition. (754-756) (Students and scholars of Hegel’s philosophy of mathematics will find particular value in the lengthy additional discussion of the calculus appended to the later account of “Quantity” [204-234], and di Giovanni’s helpful introductory gloss on it [xli-xliii].) Moreover, he supplies ample footnotes, often identifying the original German terms for his translations or referencing other points in the text or in Hegel’s other works to which the text of the Logic refers. He provides helpful references to the writings of other philosophers when Hegel’s frequent discussions of philosophy and its history refer to specific texts or works. The text includes an extensive index and bibliography.

The fact that Hegel’s text is a difficult one, not only for the translator, but for the reader too, is inescapable. Di Giovanni’s translation facilitates matters for readers as much as is possible in several ways. His translation is generally literal, and it retains, as much as possible, the structure of Hegel’s German original. He does not complicate matters by coining neologisms or introducing unfamiliar terminology for terms which could be translated by more than one English word. This feature of his translation marks one of its principal improvements over Miller’s. For example, di Giovanni renders “”“>Dasein,” the second major category of the logic of being, simply as “existence,” unlike Miller, who chooses “determinate being.” While Miller’s translation is justifiable on the basis of interpretation (at the outset of his treatment of Dasein, Hegel identifies it as “”“>bestimmtes Sein”), di Giovanni’s translation tends to leave such interpretive work to the reader. (I note one significant exception to this tendency below.) Likewise, di Giovanni renders “”“>Schein,” the first chapter of the first division of the logic of essence, as “shine,” while Miller translates it as “illusory being.” Again, di Giovanni’s translation is literal and leaves it to the reader to identify, on the basis of what Hegel says about the “shine” in essence, that it is potentially illusory. (The same is true of di Giovanni’s rendering of “”“>der Begriff” simply as “the concept,” rather than Miller’s “the Notion.”) On the whole, di Giovanni’s translation choices are direct and straightforward, while still preserving the wordplay on which Hegel periodically relies (most notably in the doctrine of essence).

In general, di Giovanni’s translation stands independent of the interpretation of the text that he offers in his introduction. There are, however, a few places where the gloss which he offers on the text’s argument affects his translation. As we have seen, di Giovanni takes the subject matter of the logic in general to be discourse, and several of his translation choices reflect this general conviction. Most notably, he sometimes translates “”“>Denken” and its cognates (the participle “”“>denkend”) as “discourse” and “discursive.” (55) “”“>Denken,” which he otherwise renders as “thinking” (a more literal translation), is central to Hegel’s project, constituting as it does the subject matter of the Logic as a whole. Certain of the occasions where di Giovanni chooses “discursive” for “”“>denkend” fit the context — for example, when Hegel stresses the need for an “enunciation and exposition” (das Aussprechen und die Darstellung) of thinking, in contrast to understanding knowledge as “figurative” (vorstellendes). However, this translation is unfortunate, if only because it suggests that for Hegel all thinking is discursive. Recent interpreters of the first Critique have stressed that, for Kant, the understanding, the faculty of concepts, is necessarily “discursive” (diskursiv). (A68/B93) For Kant, the discursivity of the understanding and of conceptuality in general entails the need to reject the idea of an understanding that is intuitive. However, Hegel explicitly states that Kant errs in dismissing outright the idea of an “intuitive understanding.” (522, 523) In short, the question of whether all thought is discursive or whether there is an important intuitive element of thinking is, for readers of Hegel, an interpretive question of some significance and not simply an issue that can be settled by translation. To his credit, whenever di Giovanni does gloss “”“>denkend” as “discursive,” he identifies the German term of Hegel’s original in a footnote.

These concerns aside, di Giovanni’s translation is scrupulously consistent, and he provides an extensive account and justification of his translation choices in the introductory materials. On the basis of the quality of his translation alone, di Giovanni’s text should supersede Miller’s as the standard English language translation for students of Hegel’s Logic.

While the Logic has continued to be inescapable for scholars of Hegel’s metaphysics, there has also been a prominent trend in recent accounts of other dimensions of Hegel’s thought — notably accounts of his practical philosophy — to suggest that the continued relevance of Hegel’s philosophy need not depend on the continued relevance of his logic. At the same time, the recent resurgence of consideration of Hegel in Anglo-American philosophy of language and philosophy of mind has largely by-passed the Logic, focusing instead on the earlier Phenomenology. However, Hegel’s critiques of Kant’s reliance on sensible and conceptual “givens” in the Logic could provide a valuable contribution to contemporary discussion which takes the work of Wilfrid Sellars as its immediate point of departure. Likewise, the explicit accounts of the fundamental concepts that run through every aspect of Hegel’s system make the Logic at least an indispensible guide for the interpretation of his other works. In any case, one hopes that this new translation might occasion renewed reflection on the place of the Logic in Hegel’s thinking.

1 This is obviously not the place to attempt to provide anything near an exhaustive account of these different interpretations. An excellent starting point remains Thomas E. Wartenberg, “Hegel’s idealism: The logic of conceptuality,” in The Cambridge Companion to Hegel, ed. Frederick C. Beiser (Cambridge University Press, 1993), 102-129.