The Science of Right in Leibniz's Moral and Political Philosophy

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Christopher Johns, The Science of Right in Leibniz's Moral and Political Philosophy, Bloomsbury, 2013, 193pp., $120.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781780936734.

Reviewed by Donald Rutherford, University of California, San Diego


This short study is a useful addition to the English-language literature on Leibniz's moral philosophy. Among its strengths are its careful attention to neglected primary texts, particularly the early New Method for Learning and Teaching Jurisprudence (of which a new partial translation is included as an appendix), and its defense of a provocative thesis about the underlying character of Leibniz's moral philosophy. Against those who have understood Leibniz's ethics to be broadly consequentialist in form, centered on the maximization of perfection or happiness (with human ends mirroring God's ends in creation), Christopher Johns argues that Leibniz's position is fundamentally deontic in outlook, based on a "science of right" that is formulated for the first time in the New Method and refined in later writings.

Johns expounds Leibniz's doctrine of right as a continuous thread that unites his moral philosophy from his earliest writings through the 1702 Meditation on the Common Concept of Justice. Chapter 1 focuses on the 1667 New Method, which Leibniz composed at the age of 21 in an effort to secure an appointment as a legal advisor to the elector of Mainz. The aim of the document was to articulate the foundations of a science of jurisprudence as a preliminary to revising existing legal codes drawn primarily from the digests of Roman law. In the work we find some of the earliest evidence of Leibniz's commitment to the use of the demonstrative method in philosophy. A rigorous science of jurisprudence must begin with definitions of basic concepts, which are linked to one another as definiens and definiendum. In section 14 of the New Method, Leibniz defines jurisprudence as the "science of actions, insofar as they are called just or unjust"; and just or unjust actions as those which "are useful or harmful to the public [publice utile vel damnosum est]" (p. 154). Thus, he appears to define the justness of an action in terms of its consequences: an action is just insofar as it promotes what is publicly useful, where the "public" may be understood to include the world as a whole, or utility with respect to the will of God, or more narrowly as what benefits humanity or the state. From this follow three distinct notions of jurisprudence: divine, human and civil (p. 155).

On Johns' reading, Leibniz's initial definitions of just and unjust specify the objective conditions of an action's rightness or wrongness, but they do not explain the ground of the rightness or wrongness. We are given an account of the latter, Johns argues, in the next section of the New Method, where Leibniz states that the "morality [Mortalitas] . . . that is, the justice or injustice of the act of the person, springs from the quality of the person." This "moral quality" in the person is twofold, consisting in "the power to act and the necessity to act [potentia agendi, & necessitas agendi], therefore, moral power is called right [Jus], and moral necessity is called obligation [Obligatio]" (p. 154). Johns takes this as the authoritative statement of a doctrine of "subjective right" that underwrites the rest of Leibniz's moral philosophy. He describes this as an "absolutely crucial point" (p. 9), so it is worth trying to unravel it.

Leibniz's definition of the justice or injustice of an act seems at first glance straightforward. Whatever the consequences of an action -- whatever its contribution to "public utility" -- the justice or injustice of the act must be understood in terms of the agent's intention, i.e., whether the agent performed the act knowing it to be permitted or required. Johns acknowledges this aspect of Leibniz's position and relates it to his moral realism: "The moral qualities constitute moral cognition, by which a person may recognize which actions are objectively just, with such recognition being a decisive factor in the resulting action" (pp. 8-9). As we have seen, the objective justness of an action is identified with its being "publicly useful," or contributing to the collective good. Yet Johns finds this inadequate as an account of Leibniz's view. Most importantly, it fails to explain the "morality" of the act of doing what is publically useful, or what we now call the normativity of the act: why it should be done. According to Johns, the ground of the morality of just and unjust acts lies in the moral qualities of agents, and these qualities themselves are to be understood in terms of the freedom essential to rational beings. In Johns' words, "we may call the moral qualities of right and obligation deontic qualities, since they constitute the self-limiting freedom of rational substances, a freedom to which they are entitled and obligated to maintain" (p. 11).

For Johns, then, the ground of all normative requirements for Leibniz is the power, or right, of rational agents to limit the expression of their desire, and the necessity, or obligation, in which they recognize the limits that the common good, or "public utility," imposes on them. Furthermore, both the subjective and the objective aspects of right are ultimately explained by the freedom that is essential to the nature of a rational being. On the subjective side, "harming others is wrong due to the kinds of beings that we are -- beings endowed with freedom, responsibility, with the capacity to inflict harm, to refrain from it and to do good. That is, we have obligations because we have natural freedom" (p. 63). But equally on the objective side, the substance of an agent's obligations to others is that she limit her action in ways consistent with the preservation and promotion of the moral nature, or freedom, of other rational beings. Thus, in the end, all morality flows from the freedom possessed by rational agents; and in this way Leibniz's position approaches that of Kant: "he bases practical philosophy upon pure reason, freedom, and self-rule (or autonomy, although not in Kant's fullest sense)" (p. xi; cf. pp. 100, 104).

Johns claims to find the core of this account in the 1667 New Method. Subsequent chapters argue for the extension of the view in Leibniz's later works. Chapter 2 offers a close reading of an important series of studies, Elements of Natural Right, composed prior to Leibniz's Paris sojourn (1669-71). Chapter 3 extends the account to works of the 1690s, including the preface to the Codex Juris Gentium, where Leibniz advances his final definition of justice as "the charity of the wise." Chapter 4 focuses on two major essays of the first decade of the eighteenth century: Meditation on the Common Concept of Justice (1702) and Opinion on the Principles of Pufendorf (1706). Although these chapters offer useful commentary on the individual works, they are primarily oriented around Johns' efforts to show that his right-based interpretation can accommodate a variety of familiar doctrines from Leibniz's moral philosophy: his exposition of "three degrees of right," expressed in the precepts "harm no one," "give to each his due," "live honorably"; the development of the doctrine of universal love as a response to Carneadean skepticism concerning the value of justice; the definition of justice as the charity of the wise; his critique of the voluntarism of Pufendorf and Hobbes; and his application of the concept of moral necessity.

The last theme is examined in detail in Chapter 5, where Johns argues for the consistency of the notions of moral necessity employed by Leibniz in the early New Method and the Theodicy, connecting both to "the obligation that a rational being has to perform the moral good," an obligation that is "inherent to the moral nature of rational beings" (p. 134). A final chapter compares Leibniz's science of right with other seventeenth-century natural rights theories, specifically, "the development of the idea of subjective right up to Grotius; Hobbes and the problem of obligation in the natural and civil state; and Locke on the possibility of demonstration in morals" (p. 137). While sketching possible lines of future research, the brevity of the chapter limits the force of the conclusions Johns is able to draw in it.

As Johns notes, the Latin term jus denotes a complex field of meanings that inform almost all discussions of practical philosophy in the seventeenth century. As such, it is essential to examine carefully how Leibniz employs the term and how his views comport with those of leading contemporary authors on the topics of natural right and natural law. Johns' contributions to this endeavor are of considerable value, though a more open-ended inquiry -- one that did not settle quite so quickly on a particular doctrine of "subjective right" -- might have yielded more fruitful results. Although Johns claims to find evidence of the view throughout Leibniz's writings, I remain unconvinced that Leibniz ascribes to the freedom of rational agents a constitutive role in the grounding of morality. Put otherwise, it is doubtful that Leibniz is as Kantian as Johns takes him to be.

On this point hangs Johns' main criticism of perfectionist readings of Leibniz's moral philosophy. Johns acknowledges that perfection and happiness are ends for Leibniz, but he denies they are ends sufficient in themselves to ground moral obligations. The "teleological components of Leibniz's moral philosophy" -- principally, the universal benevolence or charity that makes the good in general an end for an agent -- "must be understood, not primarily as principles of moral justification but rather as principles of motivation" (p. x). Hence, consequentialism or perfectionism -- that an agent ought to pursue either the greatest good or the maximal development of her own rational capacities -- cannot be self-sustaining as ethical doctrines. Rather, the consequentialist or perfectionist aspects of Leibniz's moral philosophy must be "grounded in deontic concepts":

God and humans are bound by a moral necessity to bring about the greatest perfection. But this necessity is grounded in the nature of rational substances, in their capacity for freedom, a freedom that implies constraint: namely the constraint to preserve and promote the freedom and happiness of others. (p. 134)

What seems most strained about this reading is the imposition on Leibniz of a notion of moral obligation for which there is little evidence in his mature texts. Rather than grounding practical requirements in the constraints rational agents freely impose on themselves, Leibniz consistently locates them in the "attractive" quality of good in relation to the will -- a will that is naturally disposed to pursue the good as its good.[1] "Goodness or desire for good is the perfection of the will," he writes in the Latin summary of the Theodicy (1710). "All will has the good as its object, at least the apparent good, but the divine will has as its object nothing but what is at the same time good and true."[2] As Leibniz understands it, the will's relationship to the good is not simply one of motivation. Good and evil are the proper object of the will, which provide "the reason for willing for and willing against."[3] In general, any object represented as good supplies the will -- whether divine or human -- with a reason to pursue it, a reason that must be examined by the intellect and weighed against those supplied by other objects.

Leibniz does not invoke a moral obligation to choose the best from among the possible objects of choice. Choosing in this way reflects the perfection of a rational will, which chooses the greatest good because it offers the greatest reason. While the will is motivated to pursue the greatest good or perfection, its choice is also justified by the predominant goodness of its object. That is all the normativity that Leibniz admits or requires.

The role played by precepts of justice (or what Johns calls "degrees of right") in this story requires further elaboration. According to Leibniz's definition, justice is "the charity of the wise." So understood, justice presupposes complementary powers of will and intellect: the will's inclination to pursue good and the intellect's wisdom or knowledge of the good. Perfect justice requires the perfection of both these powers: an unfailing disposition to do good to all and an infallible knowledge of how the greatest good can be done. Leibniz's three precepts of justice ("harm no one"; "give to each his due"; "live honorably") are best understood not as expressing obligations or moral imperatives, but as recipes for fulfilling the requirements of justice with increasing degrees of perfection. Minimally, one should do no evil to others, except to prevent greater evil. Beyond this, one should do good to others, when fitting, based on impartial judgments of merit. In both of these cases, the motivation for just acts may lie, at least partially, in considerations of utility or advantage. Only with the highest degree of perfection is justice pursued as an end in itself, in imitation of the example of God.

To pursue justice for its own sake is to pursue one's own highest good, since an agent's virtue is the perfection of her powers. But an agent who acts in this way, imitating God, also seeks the greatest good of all intelligent creatures. Thus, there is a convergence of Leibniz's perfectionism, which gives priority to an agent's full realization of her capacities for virtuous action, and his consequentialism, which identifies the end of virtuous action with the promotion of the greatest good of all. As he writes, "The general good in fact becomes the individual good of those who love the author of all good."[4]

These are only a few indications of how a perfectionist interpretation of Leibniz's moral philosophy might reach different conclusions than Johns' deontic approach. In the end there may be a way to bring the readings closer together, but I suspect it will have to take a different route than that taken by Johns. Still, despite these reservations, The Science of Right remains a valuable book that deserves to be read by those with interests in Leibniz's moral philosophy or in the larger history of early modern natural law theories.

[1] From this perspective, Leibniz's position is more readily assimilable to ancient ethical theories centered on the notion of good than modern theories founded on "quasi-juridical" notions of rightness of conduct. See Henry Sidgwick, Methods of Ethics, 7th ed. (Indianapolis: Hackett, 1981), pp. 105-6; and Nicholas P. White, "The Attractive and the Imperative: Sidgwick's View of Greek Ethics," in Essays on Henry Sidgwick, ed. Bart Schultz (Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1992), pp. 311-30.

[2] Causa Dei, §18. In C. I. Gerhardt, Die Philosophischen Schriften von Gottfried Wilhelm Leibniz (Berlin: Weidemann, 1875-90), vol. 6, p. 441.

[3] Ibid., §19.

[4] Theodicy, §217; op. cit. vol. 6, p. 248.