The Science of the Struggle for Existence: On the Foundations of Ecology

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Cooper, Gregory J., The Science of the Struggle for Existence: On the Foundations of Ecology, Cambridge, 2003, 336pp, $60.00 (hbk), ISBN 0521804329

Reviewed by Gregory M. Mikkelson, McGill University



In the third chapter of the Origin of Species – entitled “The Struggle for Existence” – Darwin (1859) described a welter of fascinating interactions between organisms and their environments. He also cited “ever-increasing circles of complexity” that sometimes tempt naturalists to attribute ecological phenomena to “what we call chance” rather than “definite laws”. In Chapter Four, “Natural Selection”, Darwin offered a way to abstract away from the complex details of ecology. He did so by summing all the positive and negative influences on an organism’s propensity to survive and reproduce, into a single term called “fitness”.

Seven years after the publication of the Origin, Haeckel called for a new science, “ökologie”, to investigate the struggle for existence. Would scientists then get stuck, after all, in the tangle of detail so nimbly evaded by the Darwinian fitness concept? In the 138 years since Haeckel named their science, ecologists have found other ways of navigating through this complexity. In other words, they have discovered dimensions of simplicity and order besides fitness.

Philosophers of science have mostly ignored these developments, treating ecology tangentially, if at all. Cooper’s The Science of the Struggle for Existence is an important step in redressing this neglect. The first two chapters of the book delve mostly into the history of ecology. The next three achieve a fairly thorough and integrated mix of science and philosophy. And the last three chapters focus on ideas from philosophy of science, such as those of Cartwright, Kitcher, and Salmon.

Despite having read all of the major histories of ecology, I found Cooper’s survey of the science from 1859 to around 1960 to be a good read, rich with new information and perspectives. The middle chapters also offer salient insights, some of which I will nonetheless challenge below. In the last three chapters, however, the connection between philosophy and ecology is often lost. Overall, the book is somewhat uneven – frequently philosophically astute or historically pertinent; but sometimes prone, for example, to distinctions that confuse rather than illuminate. Below, I shall focus on three main themes addressed by Cooper in Chapters Three to Eight: “the balance of nature”; natural laws; and relationships between theories, empirical evidence, and reality.

“The Balance of Nature”

“The balance of nature” motif has, at times, polarized fields related to ecology into defenders and detractors. For example, while Carson made limited but explicit use of this theme in Silent Spring, the chief respondent on behalf of the pesticide industry (Stevens) denied its relevance. Within ecology, “the balance of nature” also seems to have garnered as much support as resistance.

Cooper discusses the debate within ecology. There, it centers on questions about how closely and how often ecological systems achieve equilibrium between the forces tending to increase and those tending to decrease certain variables. Cooper confines his attention to the forces affecting the numbers of organisms within individual populations. His review of work on this topic is interesting and worthwhile. His chief conclusion is that much of it has relied too heavily on background knowledge and (relatively) . priori plausibility, rather than on new data.

But Cooper’s exclusive focus on populations obscures the fact that equilibria at higher levels of ecological organization have also played an important role in disputes about “the balance of nature”. For example, one of the most widely-cited papers in the history of ecology (Hairston et al. 1960 – known as “HSS”) postulates mechanisms for the regulation of, e.g., the biomass of entire trophic levels. And one of the most widely-cited books (MacArthur and Wilson 1967) addresses equilibria between the forces affecting the numbers of species within entire island communities. Cooper does not acknowledge these prominent claims about higher-level equilibria.

Although he is careful not to come down clearly on one side or the other of “the balance of nature” debate, Cooper’s restriction to the population level may have affected the tenor of his conclusions. For example, he asserts that “[t]he balance of nature camp supposes a level of organization and order in ecological phenomena that may not, as a matter of contingent empirical fact, be there at all.” (p. 81) But some ecologists, dating all the way back to Darwin (1859, on which see Mikkelson 2004), have realized that the properties of communities and ecosystems are often more stable – more “balanced” – than those of their constituent populations. (See, e.g., Tilman 1996 and Ernest and Brown 2001.)

Laws of Nature

Some philosophers have denied that there are any biological laws of nature. Cooper points out that some biologists, including at least one ecologist (Roughgarden 1984), have also voiced this type of skepticism. Others, however (e.g., Colyvan and Ginzburg – a philosopher and an ecologist, respectively – 2003), affirm the existence of biological, and indeed ecological, laws.

As in “the balance of nature” debate, Cooper avoids coming down consistently on either side of the dispute over laws in biology, or even just ecology. At one point, he implies that faulty concepts of lawhood have hampered the recognition of ecological laws that do, in fact, exist:

If our concept of law prevents us from recognizing laws in ecology, that does not mean that ecology is destined to become a science of case studies – a kind of natural history catalogue. It means that we need a new concept of law. (p. 113)

Cooper indeed offers a new concept – not of law, but of “nomic force”. The idea is that “there are degrees of contingency [the opposite of nomic force] among ecological generalizations.” (p. xiv) This is a welcome contribution to a discussion that has mostly presupposed a dichotomous view of laws. And Cooper explicates the promising new concept well.

However, he does not spell out how nomic force bears on the debate about biological or ecological laws. Instead, he reiterates several more times that, given the received view of laws, ecology has none. And he attempts to reconcile this conclusion with the idea that ecological theories have genuine explanatory power, despite the fact that “most philosophical accounts of theoretical explanation hold that theories explain by virtue of capturing laws.” (p. xiv)

Cooper’s commentary on laws pervades all eight chapters of the book. Some of it is unconvincing, but it also includes some intriguing ideas. For example, on the unconvincing side, he categorizes the species-area relationship as a “phenomenological” generalization that “reveal[s] empirical patterns but not… causal structure.” (p. 107) On the intriguing side, Cooper suggests a trade-off between the nomic force vs. the scope of a generalization. This, he argues, may compel us to rethink traditional ideas about how and why generalizations with wider scope (e.g., Newton’s laws of motion) explain generalizations with narrower scope (e.g., generalizations about the motion of pendulums), rather than vice-versa.

Theories of Nature

Cooper correctly diagnoses a division of labor that is often quite pronounced in ecology, between theoreticians (“modelers”) and empiricists (“measurers”). At certain points, conflict has arisen between the two. Cooper discusses this conflict, as well as the instrumentalism to which it seems to have driven some ecologists on both sides of the divide (e.g., Roughgarden 1984 again, and Peters 1991, respectively).

I view both this separation of theoretical from empirical work, and the instrumentalism that appears connected to it, as regrettable. History suggests that the best science proceeds from close, frequent interplay between theory, experiment, and observation – not from long periods of relatively independent development. Newton and Darwin, for example, were both first-rate theoreticians and empiricists. Likewise, I would argue that the best ecology gets done by theoreticians and empiricists who are either the same person or co-authors. To quote Evelyn Hutchinson, the teacher of consummate theoretician Robert MacArthur, the latter “really knew his warblers”. And recent work on relations between species diversity and ecosystem function has involved intimate interaction between theory and experiment – leading to a flourishing of both. (See Kinzig et al. 2001.)

Cooper, on the other hand, does not question the isolation between theoreticians and empiricists that led to their clashes:

A great deal of work in theoretical development involves the mathematical articulation of background ideas, often with very little actual empirical input. If the goal of theoretical modeling were the expression of ecological laws, even of the more local variety, then one would expect empirical considerations to feature more prominently in the process. (p. 170)

Rather than using this “expectation” to critique the tendency for theory to take “on a life of its own” (p. 153), Cooper tries to undermine the expectation through his effort, noted above, to de-link successful theorization and laws. Thus, he ends up apologizing for, rather than condemning, the division of labor:

To expect that every theoretical idea must immediately prove itself in the empirical arena is to misunderstand the division of labor in the pursuit of ecological understanding… (p. 269)
[T]he appropriate way to difuse [sic] the challenge is to understand the role of conceptual analysis and a priori argument in the process of theoretical modeling. (p. 270)
[A] priori plausibility arguments may be a source of frustration for the bottom-up empiricist, but they are the lifeblood of the modeling tradition. (p. 274)

This embrace of . priori reasoning is surprising, given Cooper’s earlier criticism of arguments about “the balance of nature” for relying too heavily on it.

Similarly, Cooper refrains from disagreement with ecologists who see “theory as no more than a collection of tools” (Roughgarden 1984, quoted in Cooper p. 161) “for which truth is not really the issue” (p. 123). In fact, he concurs with their instrumentalist take:

In order to render… assumptions explicit and tractable in a mathematical model, we must engage in a series of distortions and simplifications; as a consequence, the resulting model stands little chance of being literally true, even approximately. (p. 163)

But what criteria determine how close a model must be to the truth in order to qualify as approximately true? I submit that only competing models can provide such criteria. If the evidence shows that a given model is probably closer to the truth than a competitor, then scientists should, and most often do, choose the former. Appearances to the contrary result from conflating the “realism” of a model with its complexity (Mikkelson 2001).


Though I have contested certain features of Cooper’s work on “the balance of nature” and on natural laws, I recommend both to anyone interested in these topics. His analysis of controversies about population equilibria exemplifies the “value” that philosophical rigor can “add” to science. And his exploration of nomic force and its relationship to generality illustrates the reverse direction, namely the philosophical payoff to be obtained through close familiarity with science. Cooper’s ideas about nomic force deserve attention by philosophers of science in general – not just those with particular interests in ecology.

For reasons cited previously, I find the book’s outlook on the role of theory to be more thoroughly problematic. And before ending this review, I want to question a set of assumptions that, while not always explicit, seem to exert a strong pull on the overall drift of the book. To wit, an “internalist” bias seems to crop up on at least two levels, the first of which is that of philosophical methodology: “For the most part, internal questions are conceptually prior to external questions – one must be clear on the nature of ecology before examining relationships with disciplinary neighbors.” (p. ix) This statement expresses a standard presupposition in philosophy and science – that the “nature” of a thing has more to do with its internal constitution than with its external relationships.

But it is just this type of assumption that many ecologists have (at least implicitly) challenged. Consider Haeckel:

So far physiology… has, in the most one sided fashion, almost exclusively investigated… among the functions of relationship, merely those which are produced by the relations of single parts of the organism to each other and to the whole. On the other hand, physiology has largely neglected the relations of the organisms to the environment, the place each organism takes in the household of nature. (quoted in Cooper, p. 5)

Perhaps Haeckel’s position could be reconciled with the idea that the internal relations of organisms are “conceptually prior” to their external relations, but the spirit of his comment suggests otherwise.

Nevertheless, Cooper’s remarks about scientific methodology often mirror his internalist philosophical stance. In particular, they suggest a certain reluctance to take higher-level ecological entities – e.g., communities, ecosystems, etc. – seriously as units with interesting behavior relative to their environments. Above, I noted what could be seen as another symptom of this reluctance – the lack of attention paid to the role of higher-level equilibria in “the balance of nature” debate. Still another indication is the short shrift given by Cooper to ecologists’ frequent analogies between ecosystems and organisms. The tension between Cooper’s internalist slant and much of ecological thought calls for at least an explicit defense, if not a modification, of his position.

But enough quibbling. The Science of the Struggle for Existence is the best book yet on the philosophy of ecology. It should be required reading for others in this field, and also merits consideration by philosophers of biology, philosophers of science in general, and practicing ecologists.


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