The Second-Person Perspective in Aquinas's Ethics: Virtues and Gifts

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Andrew Pinsent, The Second-Person Perspective in Aquinas's Ethics: Virtues and Gifts, Routledge, 2011, 156pp., $125.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780415899949.

Reviewed by Matthew B. O'Brien


In this book, Andrew Pinsent argues for a revisionary interpretation of Aquinas's ethics that demotes the importance of the virtues relative to the gifts (dona) of the Holy Spirit, which implies that Aquinas transforms his Aristotelian inheritance more radically than many of his interpreters suppose. In the Nicomachean Ethics Aristotle argues that human flourishing consists in acquiring and then exercising certain virtues of mind and character in excellent activity of the soul over the course of a complete life. Aquinas is often thought to have modified Aristotle's picture by appending some virtues, such as charity and humility, and downplaying others, such as magnanimity, and importing an ultimately supernatural destination for the soul who lives well. On this account, Aquinas leaves the structure of Aristotelian ethics basically untouched while making some important adjustments to its content, and reserves his transformative work for metaphysical issues like creation and subsistent substances.

If Pinsent's argument is correct, however, this picture obscures the real scope of Aquinas's ethical project. Aquinas transforms the structure of Aristotelian ethics by incorporating a central role for divine gifts in addition to the moral and intellectual virtues. This effects a transformation just as radical as his development of the notion of creation ex nihilo is for Aristotelian metaphysics. (Pinsent does not draw this analogy, but it is an apt way of expressing his contention.) According to Pinsent, Aquinas reconceives Aristotle's account of God in relation to human beings, from an impersonal object of contemplation to a personal partner in a shared life. The standpoint of moral agency therefore becomes essentially second-personal for Aquinas, and on his account a moral agent who exercises a virtue by acting well thereby receives a gift from God, and this gift is a sharing in the divine life. This claim is both ontological and epistemological: gifts from God are the sources (principia) of virtuous action, and for someone's actions to be exercises of a complete virtue, he must also perform them with the knowledge that in so doing he is receiving God's gift. Without this gift of God's grace and without the agent's self-conscious cooperation with it, he would be incapable of fully moral action.

Pinsent reminds us of the theological character of Aquinas's ethics. But his real contribution, as he sees it, is to provide a general interpretive paradigm for Aquinas's work, that is, "a synthetic picture, an understanding that 'leads us out of the web of language, to the lived world'" (29). He wishes to "animate" Thomistic ethical taxonomy with "a metaphoric understanding that embodies the facts about Aquinas's virtue ethics and places them in a living context" (30). The core of Pinsent's argument is persuasive. Aquinas's ethics doesn't merely add to Aristotle, but for good or for ill, transforms him. Pinsent marshals evidence from the Summa Theologiae, the commentaries on the Sentences of Peter Lombard and Scripture, the disputed questions, as well as works by commentators in the Thomistic tradition. He shows that the gifts of the Holy Spirit play an important role in Aquinas's account of moral agency, which cannot be sequestered as an optional theological appendage, and that the role of the gifts has been neglected by many commentators. Pinsent overstates his case, however, and mischaracterizes where the significance of his insight into Aquinas's ethics lies. Both of these problems will emerge if we consider Pinsent's argument in greater detail.

From the outset Pinsent states that he "advocates a major revision to the traditional understanding of Aquinas's virtue ethics." In order to bring this about, he wants to avoid offering just another catalogue of Aquinas's treatment of the virtues, which he calls "a left-brain mode of grasping truth". Rather, Pinsent wishes to focus "on metaphoric understanding, the association of words with embodied experience that is often associated more closely with the right-brained hemisphere" (xi). We need new metaphors to understand Aquinas's ethics properly, and recognize that "new work by analytic philosophers and moral theologians has rendered the Aristotelian interpretation of Aquinas's virtue ethics completely untenable" (xi-xii). The key to understanding Aquinas, Pinsent claims, lies in attending to the role of "the gifts," which are those cognitive and appetitive dispositions that are freely given by God and are connected with the (sometimes homonymous) cardinal and theological virtues.

Aquinas inherits the doctrine of the seven gifts of the Holy Spirit from patristic authors and Scripture. He states, "The gifts of the Holy Spirit are the principia of the intellectual and moral virtues . . . while the theological virtues are the principia of the gifts" (ST II-II, Q. 19, a. 9). He pairs the cognitive gifts of understanding (intellectus) and knowledge (scientia) with the theological virtue of faith, the gift of wisdom (sapientia) with the virtue of love, and the gift of counsel (consilium) with the virtue of practical wisdom. He pairs the appetitive gifts of fear (timor) with the virtue of hope, piety (pietas) with the virtue of justice, and courage (fortitudo) with the virtue of courage. Aquinas's duplication of terms invites confusion and it will be helpful to consider an example of how a gift is supposed to work.

Take the appetitive gift of courage, which Aquinas associates with the virtue of courage. Like piety, courage can refer either to a virtue or a gift, and there are two kinds of virtue. First, there is courage as an acquired virtue. Aristotle thinks that whatever virtues there are, they are acquirable through habituation. Aquinas denies this. He argues that non-defective virtue must be infused by God directly, over and above whatever achievements can be made through merely human habituation. Thus for Aquinas courage as an acquired virtue is incomplete, and needs God's grace to be perfected. This implies that the infused virtues include not only explicitly theological virtues such as faith, hope and love, but also specifically different counterparts of human virtues such as courage or justice that are perfected by grace and therefore exceed the natural capacities of human nature. Hence Aquinas's definition of virtue, which should give pause to any Aristotelian of the strict observance: "Virtue is a good quality of the mind, by which we live righteously, of which no one can make bad use, which God works in us, without us" (ST I-II, Q. 55).

The divine gift of courage is the principium of the perfected, non-defective virtue of courage. As Aquinas says, courage "as a virtue, perfects the mind in the endurance of all perils whatever; but it does not go so far as to give confidence of overcoming all dangers: this belongs to the courage that is a gift of the Holy Spirit" (ST II-II, Q. 139, a. 1). A soldier may have become as courageous as possible, for example, but he still cannot know whether or not his fighting will ultimately achieve his goal of victory. He cannot have confidence that he will overcome even the freak or chance dangers that might harm him. Courage as a divine gift fills this gap and instills certainty in its recipient that he will in fact achieve his final end. As Pinsent puts it, the gift of courage is like the appropriation of God's providential stance towards a difficult good. "Whereas a human perspective is insufficient to ground a surety of overcoming all dangers, God perceives the entire course of one's life and has the power to ensure that a good outcome remains possible in the face of every particular danger" (55).

Aquinas discusses the gift of courage immediately after his account of courage as a virtue in ST II-II Q. 123-138. Pinsent emphasizes the complexity of this discussion, "because Aquinas claims that this gift is likened to a further attribute, a beatitude (beatitudo) called 'Hungering and thirsting for justice'. This beatitude is in turn associated with two final and distinct attributes, the fruits (fructus) of patience and long-suffering" (24). Pinsent calls this network of perfective attributes the "virtue-gift-beatitude-fruit (VGBF) structure" and points out that it reappears throughout Aquinas's treatment of the virtues. What are we to make of this at times bewildering set of connections? Pinsent insists that the VGBF structure, in its full "organic unity" (as Servais Pinckaers puts it), is "integral to Aquinas's account of human flourishing" (25). This claim is not entirely convincing. Pinsent succeeds in showing that the infused virtues are integral to Aquinas's account of human flourishing, and that the gifts are integral to the infused virtues. The beatitudes and fruits, however, do not seem to be integral. Aquinas's decision to complicate his account of the infused virtues by further distinguishing the beatitudes and fruits may stem from his desire to map the terminology of his scriptural and patristic sources onto his moral psychology, rather than any intention to posit beatitudes and fruits as core perfective attributes like infused virtues and gifts. If this is right, then the substance of Pinsent's argument is closer to commentators such as Réginald Garrigou-Lagrange than he wants to acknowledge.

In any case, Pinsent's more general ambition is to show that within Aquinas's moral psychology the roles played by gifts such as courage "have remarkable similarities to contemporary work in social cognition, especially the phenomenon of the joint attention of two persons" (xii). He claims that this work, along with work the phenomenological tradition such as Martin Buber's I-Thou, provides an interpretive paradigm for understanding Thomistic ethics as a whole.

Second-person relatedness, experienced in everyday life in the context of joint attention with another human person, provides a metaphoric understanding of all the four principal categories of Aquinas's perfective attributes [namely, the VGBF structure] . . . The range of experiences that are appropriate for Aquinas's virtue ethics can be found, instead [of with Aristotelian categories], in a range of situations involving an irreducible 'I'-'you' relationship, such as a parent playing a game with a child, or friends working together in harmony, or two people together in love. The interpretive key to Aquinas's virtue ethics is that of second-person relatedness with God, culminating in divine friendship. (100)

The possession of the infused virtues enables "a person well-ordered internally to be moved in a second-personal manner, by means of the gifts," to share in the life of God, and this sharing "is a different kind of relationship to God than is enabled by the classical Aristotelian virtues" (82).

Pinsent seems to be correct that there are some similarities between contemporary work on joint attention and Aquinas's account of moral agency. His decision, however, to structure his overall argument around such parallels strikes me as a mistake that detracts from the real contribution of his book. The structure leads to an idiosyncratic detour into empirical psychology that is ultimately unnecessary, since there is a philosophical notion already at hand that adequately expresses (and not just metaphorically) the second-personal character of Thomistic ethics: namely, friendship. (It would be rather odd if the interpretive key to Aquinas's work lies in a field of empirical research that he knew nothing about.) Furthermore, a philosophical treatment of joint attention within the context of friendship is already present in Aristotle (e.g., Eudemian Ethics 7.12), but Pinsent's rhetorical commitment to establishing the "non-Aristotelian" character of Aquinas ethics prevents him from exploring this connection. The really interesting question is not simply: can Aquinas be termed an Aristotelian? Rather, the interesting question is: are Aquinas's transformations of his Aristotelian inheritance coherent and persuasive?

Nevertheless, Pinsent's book is a valuable contribution to contemporary Thomistic ethics, and virtue theory more generally. The theological aspect of the book will probably inhibit its reception among mainstream secular moral theorists who aren't interested in Christian theology. This is unfortunate, because the book provides genuine insights into some of the central preoccupations of neo-Kantians such as Stephen Darwall and Christine Korsgaard and neo-Aristotelians such as Michael Thompson and Candace Vogler. We can hopefully look forward to these insights being fleshed out in future work by Pinsent and others.