The Second Person Standpoint: Morality, Respect, and Accountability

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Stephen Darwall, The Second Person Standpoint: Morality, Respect, and Accountability, Harvard University Press, 2006, 362pp., $49.95 (hbk), ISBN 0674022742.

Reviewed by Douglas Lavin, Harvard University


Stephen Darwall's earlier work has contributed much to the resurgence of systematic moral philosophy in the Kantian tradition. Yet here in this new book Darwall turns against his Kantian roots, insisting on the impossibility of either finding or establishing the moral law in the bare idea of rational agency. Of course, one can never entirely break with one's past: it hangs on in Darwall's sense of the questions and methods of moral philosophy, and also in his commitment to delightfully blurring the boundary between moral philosophy and its history. He pursues familiar aims -- the articulation and justification of the basic principle of morality, what Darwall calls morality as equal accountability -- in a familiar way, by meditating on a certain abstract form of practical thought. It is the starting point that is importantly different: no longer the deliberative standpoint of an individual agent deciding what to do, now it is the second-person standpoint that is supposed to hold the key to the moral philosophical city, including access to a proper account of moral rights, responsibility, obligation, dignity, respect, as well as autonomy and the distinction between theoretical and practical reason. If Darwall is right, a considerable stretch of human life is lived from within the second-person standpoint, as an "I to a you and a you to an I," to distort Hegel's formula; and if Darwall is right, moral life itself -- its form, its basic principle and its validation -- is to be found here as well. Anyone working on these topics or their history will want to investigate this very ambitious, imaginative and wide-ranging book.


What then is the second-person standpoint? Here is Darwall: "Call the second-person standpoint the perspective you and I take up when we make and acknowledge claims on one another's conduct and will" (3). A few examples to help fix ideas: feeling that I have insulted your family, you insist that I give you satisfaction; I ask you, the waiter, for another round; issuing an order to the private, the sergeant says "You must do ten push-ups." Consider the last: in making the demand, the sergeant is not merely informing the private of something or "directing him epistemically," as he might be were he to tell the private that Patton commanded the Third Army, or that one must not infer p from p or q, or that one shouldn't count one's chickens before they hatch. Instead, the sergeant aims to immediately direct the private's will; he purports to "address a second-personal practical reason" to the private. Of course, not just any demand is a valid demand, and thus not just any such demand has rational bearing on what to do -- suppose the sergeant is Red Army and the private White. Whether the sergeant's demand is valid, and thus whether he succeeds in "giving a second-personal reason," depends on whether the demand is "grounded in (de jure) authority relations" (4) holding between the two agents. If the sergeant does have the relevant practical authority, the private has a second-personal reason to do the push-ups. This does not simply mean that something speaks in favor of his doing push-ups, even something involving the sergeant, say, that it would greatly please the sergeant who, as it happens, loves watching the soldiers exercise. If the demand is valid, the private is accountable to the sergeant for compliance: the private would not merely make a mistake in failing to comply but would in some sense wrong the sergeant. The second-personal reason to do the push-ups is not "the value of any outcome or state" (78) but simply that doing so is complying with an authoritative demand and thus is doing what one is accountable to another for doing: second-personal reasons are thus "authority- rather than outcome-regarding" (248). These concepts -- valid demand, practical authority, second-personal reason and accountability to -- constitute an "interdefinable" and "irreducible" circle of second-personal concepts, according to Darwall. And occupying the second-person standpoint just is being in the distinctive normative space shaped by these concepts, the space of second-personal reasons. Chapter 3 outlines its structure, while Chapters 1 and 2 sketch the main concepts and arguments of the entire book.


What does any of this have to do with morality? Darwall answers: Nearly everything. Let's just start with something, promissory obligation. In exchange for your delivery of ten guns yesterday, I have promised to deliver ten pounds of butter tomorrow. And so I now have a reason to bring you the butter, indeed, I must. My obligation does not simply consist in having good or sufficient reason to deliver but in your "authority to demand compliance" -- I am accountable to you and have a second-personal reason for butter delivery. Promissory obligation, Darwall claims, essentially involves a second-personal form of connection between rational agents. (Chapter 8 includes an extended discussion of the topic.) Yet the bold thesis at the center of the book goes much further. The very idea of moral obligation must be understood through the second-person standpoint. Being under a moral obligation just is being morally accountable to another: "To understand moral obligation … we have to see it as involving demands that are 'in force' from the moral point of view, that is, from the (first-person plural) perspective of the moral community" (9). This passage is instructive. It indicates that the link between the moral 'must' and accountability to another is not limited to obligation created by the performance of a particular act on a particular occasion -- some demands are simply "in force." (There is a very strong temptation to read Darwall otherwise -- as holding that all second-personal reasons must be grounded somehow in actual mental acts of making and acknowledging claims and demands -- but I think it would be contrary to his intentions to do so.)[1] The link is also not limited to the obligations of one individual agent to another -- some are owed to the "moral community". This last point is crucial if Darwall is to claim that the second-person structure characterizes moral obligation in general, and is not only a thesis about, say, Hohfeldian claim rights. Indeed, in the fundamental case, moral obligation is tied to standing demands issuing from the moral community, or again, the moral point of view.

What exactly does the moral community demand? It demands compliance with "principles that are acceptable, or not reasonably rejectable, to each as free and rational agents … apt for second-personal address" (300-301). The determinate content of these principles would be given through a "hypothetical, idealized process of agreement that situates the parties as equal persons" (307), though Darwall does not say much about this: his interest is primarily in the structure and foundation of morality, not the elaboration of its content. It is crucial, however, to Darwall's way of seeing things that the demands of the moral community are not the demands of an alien authority. The moral point of view is intersubjective: "The second-person perspective of the moral community is as much one's own as it is anyone else's. One demands the conduct of oneself from a point of view one shares as a free and rational person" (35). And so, according to morality as equal accountability, what one is morally obligated to do is ultimately what one demands of oneself as a member of a community of persons all of whom are equally in a position to make such demands of themselves and of others, and to recognize their membership in such a community of persons.

Even if morality were essentially second-personal in this way, a question would linger about why I or anyone should care. The practice of dueling in a culture of honor also seems to have a second-personal shape, and yet I make no error in thinking "Ungentlemanly, so what?" Yet Darwall thinks moral obligations are categorical imperatives in the following sense: a moral 'must' purports to give any agent a conclusive reason for action, one such that, if the norm genuinely obtains, then saying "So what?" is not an option for a rational person. And so one wants to know what, if anything, can vindicate the unconditional demands of the specifically moral sphere of life-in-the-second-person. Perhaps the book's most intriguing thread tracks Darwall's attempt to show that commitment to morality as equal accountability is a condition of the possibility of occupying the second-person standpoint: when we make or acknowledge claims or demands of one another at all, we must presuppose that we share a common second-person authority and competence as free and rational agents.


So much is a bare bones sketch of the basic structure and ambition of the book. But how exactly are we supposed to make our way from the second-person standpoint all the way down the logical line to morality as equal accountability? The main argument is complicated, though it seems to proceed in three main steps. Chapters 4-5 make the first by defending the conceptual thesis of morality as accountability. The ordinary concept of moral obligation is essentially second-personal: it is the concept of what those to whom we are morally accountable have the authority to demand that we do. Darwall aligns himself with a line of thinkers who insist on a conceptual connection between moral obligation and warranted blame -- what one is obligated to do is what one can be blamed for not doing. After providing an analysis of holding someone morally responsible through blame, or other Strawsonian reactive attitudes, as a case of addressing a second-personal reason, Darwall then concludes that the concept of moral obligation is itself an irreducibly second-personal concept. (Chapter 6 extends the second-personal analysis of moral concepts to dignity and respect, here understood as respectively the authority to make claims and demands, and proper recognition of this standing.)

As Darwall repeatedly emphasizes, the truth of the conceptual thesis of morality as accountability leaves open to whom (God, family, nation, something else), on what terms (equal or not), and in virtue of what (sentience, the bare capacity to act for a reason, something else) one is accountable. The second step of the main argument is meant to answer these questions and thereby to deliver Darwall's particular specification or conception of morality.

Darwall begins with a wholesale attack on "the Kantian Project": according to it, the moral law is a standard internal to the "(first-person) deliberative standpoint alone" (214). In its ambitious form -- think Groundwork 3, Korsgaard and Wood -- the Kantian project is an attempt to derive the moral law from the bare idea of rational agency. "Any such attempt must fail," Darwall argues in Chapter 9, "since nothing in the bare project of acting for reasons, first-personally, commits a deliberating agent to autonomy" and thus to the moral law (214). Moreover, Darwall is equally doubtful of a more modest Kantian attempt to characterize what it is to be a rational agent who recognizes that it is subject to categorical 'oughts' whose validity is a posit which individual practical reason cannot prove to itself -- think second Critique and "fact of reason". However, the main argument addresses the ambitious version of the Kantian project, and I will focus on that.

Darwall's argument centers on the articulation of a certain spare form of rational agent, the "naïve practical reasoner" (216). In such a reasoner, desire is a mode of epistemic access to the values of objects and states of affairs, and the capacity to act for reasons just is the capacity to act on the basis of such considerations, or again, as Darwall says, to act on the basis of state-of-the-world-regarding, agent-neutral, reasons. Such an agent is conceivable and possible, Darwall insists, yet would not be autonomous in Kant's sense: the power to act is not itself a substantive principle of action. The possibility of this form of rational agency would be a genuine barrier to holding that autonomy and thus the moral law is internal to the bare capacity to do things on the basis of thought about what to do.

My own view is that Darwall is overreaching here: the discussion is best treated as an expression of skepticism about the Kantian project rather than as its refutation. Many Kantians will simply doubt that Darwall's "naïve practical reasoner" describes a possible form of rational agent. To refute them Darwall would need to show that his "naïve practical reasoner" must be possible or that such an agent actually exists. But at any rate, this chapter will be of special interest to those working in the Kantian tradition of moral philosophy or on Kant himself.

If one cannot look to consequences or to mere practical reason for the vindication of moral norms, the question becomes especially pressing where one can look. Much of the book is stage setting for Chapter 10, where Darwall attempts to pull the rabbit from the hat. Here he argues that you and I must presuppose the truth of morality as equal accountability in making and acknowledging demands on one another at all. The official argument is very difficult: I can only hope to convey the spirit of it here. Darwall proceeds by articulating the "normative felicity conditions" of second-personal address: these are the conditions that must hold for second-personal reasons actually to be given through making a demand. In addressing a demand I purport to give you a second-personal reason, and thus presuppose that I have the authority to hold you accountable. In holding you accountable in this way, I presuppose that you are able to comply with my demand. This does not merely mean that you can do what I have demanded that you do; you must also be able to respond to the demand as a reason, and so act from the recognition of the authority grounding my claim. To guide your conduct in this way, Darwall continues, you must be able to see my demand as something you can justifiably demand of yourself, and thus see my authority as your own, from a common point of view (249). When I tell you to do something, I presuppose the authority to do this, but I also presuppose that you can act from the same authority and thus that we are equals. And I do this simply as something with the capacity to make and acknowledge demands, as a free and rational agent capable of second-personal address.

Now, as Darwall repeatedly emphasizes, even if the above argument is successful, the task of vindication would not be complete. (Still, it is plain that this would already be a significant philosophical achievement.) Darwall thinks he must still confront the question whether the whole second-personal apparatus -- sergeants ordering privates, titans of industry exchanging guns for butter, you demanding that I step off your gouty toe -- is only "rationally optional, or worse, illusory" (277). Chapter 11, the third step along the main line of argument, confronts this question. Darwall thinks there is no more reason for skepticism about second-personal reasons than about other kinds of reason for action, e.g., reasons grounded in the intrinsic value of certain states of affairs. His ground is that second-personal reasons are compatible with the going theories of the nature of a reason for action; that is, with the going metaphysical characterizations of the kind of thing one is thinking about when thinking about what one has reason to do.

For my own part, I am less confident in the innocence of the category of second-personal reason, but more confident in its purely metaphysical interest: in it we have, I think, a problem about the efficacy of other minds. Whereas the classical problem of other minds concerns how I can know that others have mental states like my own, and thus is a problem belonging to theoretical reason, the problem that other minds present to practical reason is something very roughly like: How can the fact that others expect certain things from me, hold certain attitudes toward me, etc. -- how can any of this constitute a valid claim on my thinking about what to do, one that I must accept if I am to think rationally? Simply to hold second-personal attitudes -- attitudes which in their constitution depend on the capacity of others rationally to acknowledge my entitlement to hold them -- is already to presuppose that such claims are valid. But even if we follow Darwall in supposing that such attitudes cannot be justified by appeal to "non-second-personal" considerations, we can still demand some account of how it can belong to a sound condition of the faculty of practical reason that I, who after all am not the same agent as you, should nevertheless not merely take your reactions into account, but should submit myself to the standard of what you could deem to be reasonable.  How can it be practically rational for my allegiance to be, not merely to the reasons that there are, but to your sense of the reasons that there are -- especially if, as we have seen that Darwall argues, the latter allegiance does not necessarily belong to the sheer idea of rational agency as such?

As a reader I found myself grateful to Darwall for forcing contemporary moral philosophy to wrestle with the importance of the second-person, but also found myself wishing at many points that he would make more trouble for his basic concepts. There are a couple moments when Darwall threatens to put into relief the intriguing strangeness of the second-person, but he then quickly backs off: Chapter 11 responds to skepticism about the very possibility of second-personal reasons by displaying their compatibility with the current accounts of the nature of a reason for action; Chapter 7 asks how the capacity to occupy the second-person standpoint could possibly be realized in "human psychology, naturalistically conceived" (151), and answers that experimental psychology confirms what armchair reflection suggests -- the conduct of human beings is nearly everywhere influenced by "distinctively second-personal normative psychological capacities" (180) such as other-directed feelings like empathy or resentment. But such answers reveal that Darwall's questions are not, as one initially might have thought, the expression of astonishment at the very possibility of, say, empathy, resentment, or romantic love, or quite generally at occupying the second-person standpoint, an astonishment familiar from Rousseau and Sartre and other philosophers of the second-person. A "how possible?" question is not answered by showing that a phenomenon is actual, nor again by showing that the leading contemporary theories do not exclude the possibility of that phenomenon.[2]

Returning to the main line of argument: even if you and Darwall, and many others too, present and accept second-personal reasons, and are caught-up in all that comes in tow, what does that have to do with me? Why can't I, like Rousseau's solitary walker, just opt out of the whole business? What would be the mistake in that? After all, earlier Darwall left conceptual space for a kind of rational agent that simply does not occupy the space of second-personal reasons. How then can he later insist that this kind of agent would still "fail to appreciate what we, who have taken it up, can validate as reasons from a more comprehensive view that includes it" (277), and would thus be making a mistake of sorts? Why should we describe the position of a non-second-personal reasoner this way, as one who fails to grasp something? Why not say instead that it is simply a different form of rational agent, neither better nor worse, as we might say of plant life that it is simply a different form of life than animal life, neither better nor worse? It does not seem to me, anyway, that the Red Oak is deficient because it does not move about or feel. Darwall just seems to be assuming that the concept of practical reason is not in this respect like the concept of life. Whatever doubts one may have about the legitimacy of that assumption, it does not fit neatly with the role of the "naïve practical reasoner" in Darwall's attack on the Kantian project of vindicating the moral law.


In closing, I would like to take a step back from the details of Darwall's discussion to raise a question about the big picture. In the early chapters, Darwall talks us into the idea of the second-person standpoint and the associated circle of concepts (demand, accountability, second-personal reason and authority) by meditating on interactions between two distinct individual agents, whether, for example, sergeant and private, promisor and promisee, or I, who am standing on your foot, and you, who are telling me to get off. Yet, as the book develops, the scope for second-personal relations expands, leaving room for, indeed, requiring room for, second-person relations between me and myself, and ultimately, between me and the moral community. But does the idea of a solitary second-personal demand make sense? Does the idea of "the moral community" as a maker of demands and an occupier of the second-person standpoint?

Perhaps in ordinary life many are willing to use words like "blame", "resentment", "promise" and "demand" to describe a relation between me and myself. But this would not settle the question. After all, one might think this use of second-personal words is only by "metaphor and likeness," as Aristotle insists when considering the closely related question whether it is possible to do injustice to oneself. I am inclined to side with Aristotle on the substantive question, but I raise it here mostly to suggest that we do not yet have a firm enough hold of the very idea of a second-person relation to settle whether or not relatedness to another could be the same form of relatedness as relatedness to myself.

In any case, it may be that a general worry about the possibility of self-addressed demands is misplaced. After all, what matters most to Darwall is the possibility that I, as a member of the moral community, address a demand to myself. In this case, a general subject (one that says "we") makes a demand on a particular subject (one that says "I"), and, as it happens, the one through which the demand is given voice is the one to whom the address is directed. What could be objectionable in that?

We must be careful, however, since not just any use of "we" refers to a possible subject of second-person relations.[3] Consider this: I am in a snowstorm. There is someone across the street: I think he is in a snowstorm. Yet another person is down the block: I think she is in a snowstorm. Then, tying together these three singular judgments, I think: We are in a snowstorm. But it does not seem that this "we" refers to a possible occupant of the second-person standpoint, or even to a subject of any sort of action at all: indeed, it does not refer to a perspective or point of view from which one might address demands as a member.

Consider this instead: We are playing patty-cake. Now, it seems that this judgment cannot be analyzed as a conjunction of singular judgments: for we are only playing patty-cake if we both think we are playing patty-cake, and this condition of "mutual recognition" cannot be constituted by two independent thoughts, since each thought would have to make reference to the "we" whose significance was supposed to be analyzed into a plurality of independent individuals. Thus it seems that "we" does refer to a genuinely plural subject, one which is a possible subject of action, and indeed a possible occupant of the second-person standpoint: perhaps we promise you to stop playing patty-cake, if you will bring us some chocolate cake. Moreover, it would also seem that I can make a demand as a member of, or from the perspective of, this patty-cake community: I hold you accountable through blame when you do not fulfill your end of the bargain. Indeed, perhaps it is even possible that I, as a member of this patty-cake community, make a demand on myself considered as a separate individual. However provisional this sketch of some forms of first-person plural, hopefully it is enough to sharpen the question for Darwall: Is the moral community a "we" of the right kind?

A reason for suspicion: Darwall's moral community is an ideal. Like Rousseau's general will, the moral community is always right: for "the (first-person plural) perspective of the moral community" just is the moral point of view (9). And in Darwall's hands, norms or ideals do not seem to have enough actuality or reality to directly enter into an account of what happens and so to be the subject of any action at all, including the address of claims and demands. But if the moral community is not the same form of community as either the snowstorm community or the patty-cake community, then what form of community or "we" is it?

The danger for Darwall is that talk of the "perspective" and "point of view" of the moral community is, in the end, only a personification of the validity of certain categorical norms. And this would not, I think, be enough to sustain Darwall's second-personal conception of morality on which "We make moral demands, and hold ourselves and one another accountable, from the perspective of equal members of the moral community" (307). For it would collapse the distinction between genuine Darwallian moral activity, in which "we address demands to each of us" (114), and a mere simulation in which one simply measures actions against a certain norm, as some alien anthropologists might do for fun, each bringing her own conduct and the conduct of others under the "demands" of the "moral community," without ever genuinely taking up the second-person standpoint.

The articulation of the second-person standpoint might be seen as part of an understanding of what it is to be a rational animal that is also, and inextricably, a social animal. Darwall has shown that there is a real and fascinating topic here, one of great significance for ethical theory and for philosophical psychology quite generally. I have been trying to raise some questions about Darwall's attempt to tease the fundamental moral principle and its validity out of the very idea of the second-person standpoint. But whatever questions one has about this, one's curiosity will be repeatedly sparked by this fertile, erudite and challenging work of philosophy.

[1] For further discussion see R. Jay Wallace, "Reasons, Relations, and Commands: Reflections on Darwall", Ethics, 118 (2007).

[2] It is worth mentioning here Reflections on Human Nature (Baltimore: Johns Hopkins University Press, 1961), A. O. Lovejoy's largely forgotten study of seventeenth and eighteenth century thought on the topic, as well as "What Is It to Wrong Someone: A Puzzle about Justice," Michael Thompson's recent attempt to articulate the striking metaphysical presuppositions of second-personal normativity, in Reason and Value: Themes from the Philosophy of Joseph Raz, eds. R. Jay Wallace et al. (Oxford: Clarendon Press, 2004).

[3] For an illuminating discussion of forms of "we", see Matthias Haase, "Drei Formen der Ersten Person Plural," Deutsche Zeitschrift für Philosophie, 55 (2007).