The Second Sex

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Simone de Beauvoir, The Second Sex, Constance Borde and Sheila Malovany-Chevallier (trs.), Random House, 2010, 822pp., $17.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780307277787.

Reviewed by Nancy Bauer, Tufts University


This is a review of the new English-language translation of Simone de Beauvoir's magnum opus, Le deuxième sexe (1949), particularly with respect to its value for readers interested in Beauvoir as a philosopher. An important and unqualifiedly positive difference between this translation and the only other one available in English, which came out in 1952, is that the new translation has restored 145 pages of the original 972-page French original that the older English version omits, often willy-nilly and always without annotations or signposts. For the first time, Anglophone readers do not have to wonder whether the particular section of the book they're reading is filled with hidden holes.

We must not undervalue the importance of this restoration. And it is a relief to find that some of most grievous errors in the old translation have been eliminated. But the new translation is on the whole a disappointment, and not just from the point of view of those interested in the book as a work of philosophy, though the sting for us will be especially acute. Some of the problems that plague the old translation reappear in the new, and there are fresh ones as well. Most exasperatingly, the translators of the new version often sacrifice readability and clarity in favor of a highly unidiomatic word-by-word literalism that hampers the flow of Beauvoir's prose and often obfuscates its meaning. There are crucial places in Beauvoir's argument in which the new translation is decidedly superior to the old. On the whole, however, the new version often taxes the reader's patience and obscures Beauvoir's views.

Like Proust in À la recherche du temps perdu, Beauvoir in Le deuxième sexe displays a fondness for unusually long sentences and paragraphs and uncommon punctuation practices -- in her case, a penchant for the semi-colon and, in Proust's, a paucity of commas. In addition to making decisions about the best way to render individual words, phrases, and sentences, translators of highly stylized writings such as these are obliged to adopt a general strategy for achieving two desiderata that are fundamental to good translation and yet often in tension with one another: staying as faithful as possible to the author's way of doing things -- including her or his fondness for various language-specific tropes, such as metaphor, synecdoche, and alliteration -- while making sure that doing things this way makes sense in the target language.

Because striking this balance is an art, not a science, it's always possible for a work to be rendered in markedly different but nonetheless credible ways. Anglophone readers of Proust, for example, disagree about whether the new Penguin version of À la recherche du temps perdu, with a different translator for each of the six volumes, is superior to the classic C. K. Scott Moncrieff rendering from the 1920s, even though both camps generally acknowledge the integrity of both translations. The difference between the titles of these two works -- In Search of Lost Time versus Remembrance of Things Past -- perhaps epitomizes the difference between the translations as a whole. As his title suggests, Moncrieff chose to take certain liberties with Proust's prose in the service of telling the story in the loveliest English he could craft. Lydia Davis, the translator of the more recent version's first volume (Du côté de chez Swann), on the other hand, made preserving the construction and flow of Proust's sentences her highest priority.

We find a similar divergence in translation strategy in the old and new versions of The Second Sex. The original translator, Howard M. Parshley, was inclined to play fast and loose with word choice and sentence construction. Constance Borde and Sheila Malovany-Chevallier, the translators of the new version, were guided by the principle that bringing to light what they call the "logic" of the text required cleaving as closely as possible to Beauvoir's choice of and arrangement of words; thus, for instance, s'accomplir is ordinarily translated as "accomplish oneself," rather than the usual "is fulfilled," and some paragraphs go on for almost three pages.[1]

Our choice in this case, however, is not between two viable interpretative strategies. It's between two inadequate renderings, both produced by well-intentioned but inexperienced translators. While Moncrieff and Davis were clearly prepared to take on À la recherche, each having translated many other literary works from French into English, neither Parshley nor Borde and Malovany-Chevallier had ever taken on the translation of a long piece of French theoretical writing. Nor could they bring to the task experience in the disciplines -- most notably philosophy, but also anthropology, psychoanalysis, social theory, history, and literary criticism -- that Beauvoir adduces and practices in the book.

The story of how Le deuxième sexe landed on the desk of Parshley is notorious. Soon after it was published in June of 1949, Blanche Knopf, wife of the publisher Alfred A. Knopf, visited France, saw lots of people carrying volume I of Beauvoir's new book, and urged her husband to buy what she thought might be the next Kinsey Report. Taking his wife's advice, Alfred Knopf engaged as translator a friend of his who happened to be a retired Smith College zoologist specializing in human sexuality. Howard Parshley, who had never professionally translated anything from French into English, soon realized that he was in over his head: not only was The Second Sex a dauntingly long piece of writing, but it was also primarily a work of philosophy, albeit one crammed with facts, figures, theories, and examples from many other disciplines and genres. Determined to do the book justice, he spent almost two years on the project and complied, albeit not enthusiastically, with Knopf's demand to make substantial cuts.

The cuts first came to light in 1983, in a landmark essay by the philosopher Margaret A. Simons. Twenty years later, in what is in effect a companion essay to Simons's, the feminist theorist and literary scholar Toril Moi (2002) focused on other problems with the Parshley translation, including its seriously misleading mistranslations of key philosophical terms. Take for example, a key sentence at the end of the long "History" section of Le deuxième sexe:

Il s'ensuit que la femme se connaît et se choisit non en tant qu'elle existe pour soi mais telle que l'homme la définit. (Beauvoir (1949), 233-234; my emphasis here and below)

Parshley renders this sentence thusly:

It follows that woman sees herself and makes her choices not in accordance with her true nature in itself but as man defines her. (Beauvoir (1952), 137-138)

Anyone with a little French and a passing familiarity with twentieth-century continental philosophy (not to mention the master-slave dialectic) will recognize existe pour soi as a philosophical technical term. To "exist for self" is, roughly speaking, to be the kind of being whose choices play a central role in shaping his or her life. This kind of being is to be contrasted with being-in-itself, which a bearer has by nature or circumstance -- for example, being intersexed or living in fourteenth-century China or standing to inherit the family farm. For human beings, according to the likes of Sartre and Beauvoir (and, with some conceptual tweaking, Heidegger), the meaning or significance of being-in-itself is never a mere given: it's always something that we, sometimes individually and sometimes collectively, allow to matter in our lives in this or that way. So when Parshley translates existe pour soi to mean women's "true nature in itself," he is exactly reversing Beauvoir's meaning. And there are dozens more such egregious errors throughout the text.

In 1999, Borde and Malovany-Chevallier attended a conference in Paris celebrating the fiftieth anniversary of the publication of Le deuxième sexe. Expatriate Americans who met in college in the US and moved to France in the 1960s, Borde and Malovany-Chevallier were both teachers of English at the Institut d'Etudes Politiques (popularly known as Sciences Po). In addition to co-writing numerous cookbooks, some in English and some in French, as well as books on the English language for Francophones, the two had done some side-by-side English translations in French publications on various art and architecture exhibitions.[2] Shocked to hear so many conference speakers bemoan the Parshley translation, they contacted a former student of Malovany-Chevallier's, Anne-Solange Noble, the foreign rights editor of Gallimard, which publishes Le deuxième sexe, and volunteered to do a new translation.

Noble put Borde and Malovany-Chevallier in touch with an editor at Knopf, who expressed some interest in the proposal but never followed up. At the same time, Knopf was parrying numerous appeals by Beauvoir scholars for a new English translation. In 2004, The New York Times Book Review brought the translation problems to the attention of the general public, giving Noble a fresh reason to push for a new version of The Second Sex. She went to the British publishing house Jonathan Cape, which, like Knopf, is now a Random House company and which owns the British publishing rights. Cape contracted with Borde and Malovany-Chevallier and in November of 2009 debuted the British edition of the new translation. Errors called to the translators' attention before the printing of the Knopf version, in April of 2010, have also been corrected in the paperback version, which appeared under Random House's Vintage imprint in May of 2011.

Not surprisingly, there are moments at which the Borde/Malovany-Chevallier (hereafter, BMC) translation is better than Parshley's. Here's a representative example:


A vrai dire, on ne naît pas génie: on le devient; et la condition féminine a rendu jusqu'à présent ce devenir impossible. (Beauvoir (1949), 226-227)


To tell the truth, one is not born a genius: one becomes a genius; and the feminine situation has up to the present rendered this becoming practically impossible. (Beauvoir (1952), 133)


If truth be told, one is not born, but becomes, a genius; and the feminine condition has, until now, rendered this becoming impossible. (Beauvoir (2011), 152)

The opening main clause of the original French sentence has precisely the same structure as the iconic opening line of volume II of The Second Sex: "One is not born, but rather becomes, a woman."[3] Parshley, who of course could not know how famous this line would become, nonetheless needlessly obscures this rhetorical similarity. Laudably, Borde and Malovany-Chevallier do not.

Substantively, Parshley makes two further -- and characteristically -- bad choices here. First, he uses the word "situation" to render the French word condition. "Situation" is a key technical term in The Second Sex, one that Beauvoir chose not to use here. For her, "situation" has to do with the way that an individual as being-for-itself is tempted to take up being-in-itself in accordance with social norms. (Here, Beauvoir differs quite sharply from Sartre, whose voluntarism has him categorizing social norms as just another species of being-in-itself, that is, as one among many circumstances in an individual decision-maker's life, all of which he can choose simply to overlook.) Ordinarily, when Beauvoir uses "condition" instead of "situation," she is referring to the ubiquity of these misogynistic norms, not to the way that women are inclined to respond to them.

Second, Parshley gratuitously has Beauvoir saying that a woman's becoming a genius is "practically" impossible. The practice of qualifying Beauvoir's views is disturbingly typical of him: he is wont to soften or otherwise modify Beauvoir's claims in accordance with his own judgments. As it happens, Beauvoir was not just incidentally committed to the view that there have been no women geniuses. She discusses it in numerous places, and the starkness of this judgment is critical to her view.[4]

BMC's version of the sentence typifies their translation strategy. Except for their making sure that the first clause of the sentence mimics in style the opening line of volume II and handling the fact that "rendered" and "this becoming" can only be separated in English with intolerable awkwardness, they translate pretty much word-for-word. One might imagine that, especially when it comes to as complex a work as The Second Sex, this strategy is a sound one. But often it produces unidiomatic or otherwise ungainly English.

Let's revisit, for example, the following sentence of Beauvoir's:

Il s'ensuit que la femme se connaît et se choisit non en tant qu'elle existe pour soi mais telle que l'homme la définit. (Beauvoir (1949), 233-234; my emphasis here and below)

Again, here's Parshley mucking it up:

It follows that woman sees herself and makes her choices not in accordance with her true nature in itself but as man defines her. (Beauvoir (1952), 137-138)

BMC is careful to correct this gross mistranslation:

It follows that woman knows and chooses herself not as she exists for herself but as man defines her (Beauvoir (2011), 156).

The difficulty posed to the reader by "exists for herself" is a philosophical difficulty, imposed by Beauvoir, not the translators, who were right to translate it literally. But BMC's tendency to choose the evidently closest English cognate for a multivalent term -- even to the point of risking using a faux ami -- produces unnecessary diction problems. Se choisir, though reflexive in structure, does not mean "to choose oneself"; neither is there reason to think that it (or -- see above -- s'accomplir) is a term in Beauvoir's technical arsenal.[5] Se choisir ordinarily means "to choose," but in this instance the indirect object is perhaps semantically appropriate: "to choose for oneself." The sentence might read more smoothly, then, if it were rendered thusly:

It follows that woman knows herself and makes choices for herself not as she exists for herself but as man defines her.

Notice, too, that Parshley's version, though it contains a serious error, otherwise conveys Beauvoir's meaning in an elegant way.

One clunky sentence does not a poor translation make. The problem is that we find numerous slightly off (or more than slightly off) sentences on every page of the book, including many in the crucial opening pages of the "Myths" part of volume I, in which Beauvoir appropriates in detail Hegel's master-slave dialectic in her explanation for the persistent imbalance in relations between men and women. I find myself either stopping to puzzle things out or reaching for the original French edition no less frequently than when I read the Parshley. Over the course of page after page of reading, this gives one the brain equivalent of eye strain.

The readability of BMC is diminished further by the translators' decision to preserve Beauvoir's use of very long sentences and paragraphs. Here, from their note at the beginning of the book, is their rationale:

Long paragraphs (sometimes going on for pages) are a stylistic aspect of [Beauvoir's] writing that is essential, integral to the development of her arguments. Cutting her sentences, cutting her paragraphs, and using a more traditional and conventional punctuation do not render Simone de Beauvoir's voice. Beauvoir's style expresses her reasoning. Her prose has its own consistent grammar, and that grammar follows a logic. (Beauvoir (2011), xvii-xviii)

The translators do not elaborate on these claims. In practice, the flow of the prose in BMC takes a back seat to a dogged attempt to pay homage to Beauvoir's French sentence structures. Here is a typical instance of the problem, from a section of the book in which Beauvoir is discussing patriarchal societies in the ancient world:

In Persia, polygamy is customary; woman is bound to absolute obedience to the husband her father chooses for her as soon as she is nubile; but she is more respected than among most Oriental peoples; incest is not forbidden, and marriage takes place frequently among sisters and brothers; she is in charge of educating the children up to the age of seven for boys and until marriage for girls. (Beauvoir (2011), 93)

And here is Parshley's version:

In Persia polygamy was customary; the wife was required to be absolutely obedient to her husband, chosen for her by her father when she was of marriageable age; but she was held in honor more than among most Oriental peoples. Incest was not forbidden, and marriage was frequent between brother and sister. The wife was responsible for the education of children -- boys up the age of seven and girls up to marriage. (Beauvoir (1952), 85-86)

It's hard to see how the BMC version, which omits only a single comma at the end of the sentence, gives us better access to Beauvoir's reasoning than does the Parshley version, which in this case, at least, is mercifully free of disastrous errors.[6]

One might object that BMC is simply preserving Beauvoir's original sentence structure and that responsibility for any impenetrability ought to be laid at Beauvoir's doorstep.[7]But as Toril Moi (2010), following the linguist Jacqueline Guillemin-Flescher -- a leading expert in French-English translation problems -- notes, "English requires more explicit, precise and concrete connections between clauses and sentences than French," while "French accepts looser syntactical relations."[8]

This is a fact well known to any seasoned English translator of a complex and challenging piece of French writing. In this regard, Lydia Davis, the translator of the new Swann's Way, leaps to mind: one can only dream about what she might have brought to the Beauvoir project, given her experience with Proust's idiosyncratic style, which is interestingly counterpoised by her own penchant as a writer -- of excellent short stories -- for extreme terseness. In response to Moi's London Review of Books essay on the new Second Sex, and to a letter of mine supporting it, Anne-Solange Noble (the Gallimard editor) accuses me of demanding from her -- at a conference on Beauvoir in Paris in 2008 -- that the translation be supervised and annotated by an advisory board to be headed by "such distinguished professors" as myself.[9] Never mind that Noble is confusing me with another interlocutor (perhaps because I witnessed this conversation, which she in fact had with another philosopher). My view has always been that the project first and foremost required an expert translator who had demonstrated in earlier work a talent for dealing with the sorts of conceptual and rhetorical challenges Le deuxième sexe poses.

In her letter to the London Review of Books, Noble writes: "Annotated editions and companion books can follow later . . . but let readers first discover this essay in English the way French readers discover it in French -- and people around the world in their own un-annotated editions." Though nothing prevents someone who cares about the text to write a detailed concordance for the book, Random House has a lock on the translation rights for Le deuxième sexe until the original copyright expires in the year 2047. So as long as BMC sells, an annotated edition is hardly likely to follow.

BMC as it stands does include a few annotations, but they are routinely unhelpful, or worse. For example, on p. 7, we find Beauvoir's use of the term Mitsein footnoted by the translators as follows: "Mitsein can be translated as 'being with'. The French term réalité humaine (human reality) has been problematically used to translate Heidegger's Dasein." Note that here we do not learn that Mitsein itself is a Heideggerian term. For some readers, this will make the remark about Dasein even more baffling. The remark itself gives us to wonder who is "problematically" translating Dasein, and why. As it happens, la réalité humaine is the conventional French translation of Dasein -- a Heideggerian term of art that in most languages, including English, is conventionally not translated at all. Though non-Francophone readers may not be aware of this fact, there's nothing inherently problematic about the translation practice. What's problematic is that anyone translating la réalité humaine into English is likely to render it "human reality" and thereby to obscure the connection with Heidegger. Because BMC's announcement of this connection is linked with Beauvoir's use of the term Mitsein, the burden is on the reader is unnecessarily heavy.

All things considered, which translation is better? This is like asking whether it's better to burn the cake or undercook it. The issue is moot for anyone who teaches classes in which The Second Sex is a mainstay: not surprisingly, Random House has discontinued printing the Parshley version. But what if you want to teach excerpts of the book? My strategy will be to warn my students about the problems with both versions; provide them with the Parshley and a list of howlers; and make BMC and the French available to those who want and are able to make comparisons. I would advise someone who wants to read the whole book but cannot manage the French to try the BMC and hunt down the Parshley if the going gets too tough -- all of this while holding my nose.

Like Parshley, the team of Borde and Malovany-Chevallier took on the gargantuan project of translating Beauvoir's sprawling meditation because they were huge admirers of the book and wanted to bring her work to an Anglophone audience. But good intentions do not a masterpiece make. Committed readers of Beauvoir readily acknowledge this distinction when it comes to the Parshley version, which is universally regarded as inadequate. I have been startled to find that some of these same readers are inclined to overlook the flaws of the new translation, for fear, as one correspondent put it to me, that lamenting them publicly will provide fodder for anti-feminists and those inclined to dismiss Beauvoir as a philosopher. This stance -- which carries a whiff of the "good girl" norm that Beauvoir urged us to question -- not only does contemporary readers of Beauvoir a grave disservice: it also signals to future generations that we were willing to settle for less than we, and Beauvoir herself, deserve.


Bauer, Nancy (2001). Simone de Beauvoir, Philosophy, and Feminism. New York: Columbia University Press.

Bauer, Nancy (forthcoming). "Introduction to 'Femininity: The Trap'." Beauvoir's Feminist Writings [working title]. Edited by Margaret A. Simons. Champaign, IL: University of Illinois Press.

Beauvoir, Simone de (1947). "Femininity: The Trap." Vogue, March 15, 232-234.

Beauvoir, Simone de (1949). Le deuxième sexe I. Paris: Gallimard.

Beauvoir, Simone de (1952). The Second Sex. Translated by Howard M. Parshley. New York: Knopf.

Beauvoir, Simone de (1979). "La femme et la creation." Les écrits de Simone de Beauvoir. Edited by Claude Francis and Fernande Gontier: 458-474.

Beauvoir, Simone de (2011). The Second Sex. Translated by Constance Borde and Sheila Malovany-Chevallier. New York: Vintage.

Guillemin-Flescher, Jacqueline (1981), Syntaxe comparée du français et de l'anglais: Problèmes de traduction. Ophrys.

Moi, Toril (2002). "While We Wait: Notes on the English Translation of The Second Sex." Signs: Journal of Women in Culture and Society 17:4, 1005-1035. Reprinted in The Legacy of Simone de Beauvoir, edited by Emily Grosholz (New York: Oxford, 2004).

Moi, Toril (2010). "The Adulteress Wife." London Review of Books 32:3 (February), accessed July 25, 2011.

Simons, Margaret A. (1983). "The Silencing of Simone de Beauvoir: Guess What's Missing From The Second Sex." Women's Studies International Forum, 6:5, 559-64. Reprinted in Simons, Beauvoir and The Second Sex: Feminism, Race, and the Origins of Existentialism, (Lanham, MD: Rowman & Littlefield, 1999).

Sommers, Christina-Hoff (2011). "Not Lost in Translation." Claremont Review of Books (March 28), accessed July 25, 2011.

[1] For Borde and Malovany-Chevallier's translation strategy, see their "Translators' Note." For more on their translation of s'accomplir, see Moi (2010). Moi's review is required reading for anyone interested in a comprehensive overview of the problems with the new translation.

[2] Collecting the full bibliography for Borde and Malovany-Chevallier is difficult, since many of the books they wrote or translated are now out of print.

[3] This is Parshley's version; BMC, for reasons that remain murky, despite their attempts to explain them, chose to leave out the indefinite article. In a letter in response to Moi'sLondon Review of Books review (see note 1), in which Moi discusses the idiosyncrasies of the French indefinite article and shows why leaving out the "a" constitutes a mistake, Borde and Malovany-Chevallier explain their choice this way: "The division of human beings into 'woman' and 'man' is foundational, categories having nothing to do with other nouns."

[4] See for example, Beauvoir (1947) and Beauvoir (1979, p. 471); see also Bauer (2001) and Bauer (forthcoming) for support for the claim that Beauvoir's view on women and genius is central to her views.

[5] BMC is also filled with obscure English cognates for non-philosophical technical terms. Here are some examples from Beauvoir (2011; meaning and page numbers in parentheses): "gens" (family, 77); "steatopygous" (a large mass of fat on the buttocks, 79); "agnation" (as Parshley puts it in Beauvoir (1952), "inheritance through the male line"; 87); "pessaries," (plastic devices that fit in women's vaginas to prevent pregnancy).

[6] Bizarrely, BMC is not consistent about punctuation: sometimes, for instance, the translators use dashes where Beauvoir uses semi-colons and commas. See the first paragraph of the "Myths" section of volume I, for instance (Beauvoir (2011), 159)

[7] In an astonishingly poorly argued review of the new translation, Christina Hoff Sommers moves with no argument -- and with no quotation of the original French -- from the judgment that there are problems with both translations of The Second Sex to the claim that Beauvoir herself was a bad thinker and writer. See Sommers (2011).

[8] See Guillemin-Flescher (1981).

[9] The letter is published on the same webpage as Moi (2010).