The Self and Its Emotions

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Kristján Kristjánsson, The Self and Its Emotions, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 288pp., $89.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521114783.

Reviewed by Owen Flanagan, Duke University


This is an unusually comprehensive, fair-minded, empirically informed, and philosophically adept book on the self. Kristjánsson's bold positive view has two components: it is metaphysically realist: there really is a self; and it is morally realist: a normal human self is emotionally engaged with tracking the moral good. The first thesis is better defended than the second. And it is independently more plausible.

In the first two chapters, Kristjánsson focuses the reader's mind on the general question: "What is this thing called 'self' then and what is its psychological, philosophical and educational relevance?" The more specific question that interests him is "what role do emotions play in the creation and the constitution of the self." The self -- the self that is stable and real, at any rate -- consists of a person's core commitments, traits, aspirations and ideals. This self is largely a "moral self," in the sense that it is both driven by and constituted by what we could broadly call commitments to a certain conception of the good life. Because humans, according to Kristjánsson, can detect moral truth, our conceptions of the good life are often on track. A self is attached to its intentions, projects, and ideals and thus real selves are emotionally driven. Moral emotions like shame, guilt, and pride are especially important in guiding and correcting a course for selves so conceived.

Because Kristjánsson is a realist about the self and also a moral realist or moral objectivist, he has little patience with postmodern ironist or performative conceptions of the self, which conceive of the selves as metaphysically evanescent and normatively frivolous.

After laying out the framework, Kristjánsson turns in chapter 2 to a discussion of how one might vindicate a view that posits a real self beneath or behind self-representation. He discusses an idea that I proposed in Varieties of Moral Personality: Ethics and Psychological Realism (Harvard, 1991) that distinguishes between self-represented identity (SRI) and actual full identity (AFI), where the latter is something like the story of some person's life as told from God's point of view, where God knows all the facts and has exactly the right theory of action. The troubling question for the realist is what sense is there to the idea of actual full identity (AFI) without the God prop? One answer available to the scientific realist is that actual full identity (AFI) is the story as told from the perspective of our best scientific theory, for example, psychoanalysis, social psychology, cognitive neuroscience, take your pick. The worry is that these theories all couch the explanation of action in unfamiliar scientific terms, not in terms of the theory of action framed in the common sense language of ideals and commitments. Kristjánsson weaves around this worry without fully engaging its seriousness, resting too comfortably in a realism rooted in excessive confidence about folk psychological ways of thinking about the self.

In chapters 3 and 4, Kristjánsson explores the consequences of the demise of Lawrence Kohlberg's stage theory in moral psychology, which provides a natural teleology for a moral self, culminating in a Kantian self. He resists reading the fall of Kohlberg's program as requiring a return to the old division of labor between moral psychologists and ethicists, where the first describe and explain, the latter propose norms. Kristjánsson provides a helpful analysis of self-conscious emotions such as pride, shame, guilt, self-satisfaction, and self-disappointment. And he argues that the empirical evidence reveals that Aristotle's megalopsychoi is underestimated as an important feature of mature and healthy selfhood insofar as "pride sustains commitment to long-term moral action, and . . . this emotion is intimately linked to selfhood and volition from childhood onwards (p. 85)."

In chapters 5, 6, and 7, Kristjánsson extends the discussion of the idea of the self as moral character. He provides a helpful response to situationism, that naughty trouble-maker in philosophy in the last fifteen years, which psychologists gave up on in its strong form in the late 1960's. He introduces the reader to the vast amount of empirical research on the self, especially debates about whether self-assessment involves something like record keeping of the ratio of achievements to aspirations as opposed to the idea that matters are less cognitive and calculative.  On the latter view, self-assessment involve mostly tracking the quality of one's life by self-relevant emotions that perceive one's moral quality. The discussion of "self-respect" and "self-esteem" interweave the philosophical and psychological literatures helpfully.

Chapters 8, 9, 10 are opinionated applications of the overall theory and suffer a bit from channeling the least plausible aspect of Kristjánsson's view, the moral objectivist/realist part. In chapter 8, "Multicultural Selves," Kristjánsson sensibly resists the reading of Eastern (communitarian) and Western (individualistic) ways of self-making as incommensurable. He provides evidence that there often is "synergetic bicultural integration" and argues that, at any rate, communitarian and liberal theories of the self recognize similar goods, but just weigh them differently. This is the position that Kristjánsson's objectivism requires. But it seems a bit glib. In chapter 9, "Self Pathologies," we get a bit of preaching and analysis about suicide bombers who are engaged in "acts of deluded self enhancement" and Paris Hilton's "raunch culture," which goes to show that culture can get moral searchers off the track. Finally in chapter 10, we get a critique of the way postmodernism has crept into the work of (otherwise) smart psychologists. The conclusion of each of these last three chapters is that the better analysis is that self-change and self-transformation are best conceived as parts of an emotion-driven search for objective truth. Kristjánsson believes this is true both descriptively (it is true) and normatively (it ought to be), but these claims are under-argued.

These last chapters detract some from an otherwise fine, comprehensive, and judicious book. Philosophical psychology at the person-level has suffered some in this age of neuro-everything. Kristjánsson shows that the self, its nature, function, and prospects, matter a lot to philosophy, psychology, and education, as well as to ordinary life. It would be good to have more books attuned to the topic by philosophers as willing to engage the literature in psychology, which is much, much bigger, and often better, than philosophers imagine.