The Self and Its Shadows: A Book of Essays on Individuality as Negation in Philosophy and the Arts

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Stephen Mulhall, The Self and Its Shadows: A Book of Essays on Individuality as Negation in Philosophy and the Arts, Oxford University Press, 2013, 327pp., $65.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780199661787.

Reviewed by Daniel D. Hutto, University of Hertfordshire


Here's a riddle for you: When are you ever properly yourself? An answer: When you are not yourself. Phenomenological and existential thinkers who are attracted to this answer to the puzzle about personal identity maintain that we should conceive of selfhood as a sort of nothingness. Accordingly, to be a self is not to be some kind of entity. Selves are not essences or egos -- not some sort of subjective pearls -- that continue or persist though changes. Selves are not what remain constant; they are always in flux. Against the backdrop of classical thinking about identity and difference this view of the self is "apparently paradoxical or perverse" (ix). It offends against the deeply held and fiercely voiced intuitions of many philosophers. What support can be offered on its behalf?

Philosophically speaking, a diverse range of considerations speaks in its favour. One thing this book does well is to collect these together and cast fresh light on them. For example, it shows us how this view of the self is promoted by Wittgenstein's observation that it is a misleading picture -- a sort of philosophical mythology -- to employ a crude Augustinian 'name-object' model when it comes to thinking about our ordinary language games with names. Liberated from that style of thinking, when we look more carefully at how we actually use proper names for particular people and objects -- whether fictional or real -- nothing bars the way of our understanding "identity as fluid or metamorphic -- its blazing, brilliant plasticity capable of undergoing the most extreme transformations without losing integrity, of suffering endless reshapings without loss of continuity" (p. 13). Sartre's insistence that, at least when it comes to us, existence precedes essence is the locus classicus of the idea that selves are not objects.

If selves are not instances of more general types, then they do not admit of individuation and classification in the familiar scientific mode. Selves are not mere tokens of types; thus they are not to be conceived of in a reified manner as individual instantiations but rather as exemplars exhibiting particularity and individuality (pp. 272-74). Concomitantly, personal identity is not a matter of somehow managing to keep oneself together -- of remaining the same over time. Quite the opposite: being a human person is an endlessly creative business. And so, on this view, it is possible to draw an analogy between us and the busy bees described in Nietzsche's Genealogy of Morals: we are "always on the way to or from home but never at home -- always not-at-home" (p. 223). We are always in dynamic motion, moving from one state to another -- never standing still, never 'the same', always in the active process of becoming. In never staying the same, selves unfold dynamically through a process of continuous self-overcoming. It is for this reason that Stephen Mulhall mentions not just the self but its shadows in the book's title. For to think of the self as always on the move is to think of it as an incessant wanderer; and we must realize that the shadow cast by such a wanderer will "usually lie either before [the person] (as an ideal to be obtained) or behind [the person] (as an ideal that has been obtained and so is to be overcome)" (p. 172).

The central topic -- that selfhood is at bottom a matter of non-self-identity -- is examined tirelessly in its 319 pages, from multiple directions, drawing on a host of voices and perspectives, and all the while taking whatever inspiration and support it finds from the philosophical insights of Nietzsche, Sartre, and Wittgenstein. We are treated to a careful and often insightful examination of specific philosophical passages and, sometimes, whole texts -- such as Wittgenstein's remarks on names and meaning and his challenge to logical atomism, or Nietzsche's writings in praise of the scientific spirit and his allegory about the genealogy of morals. Interestingly, in what may seem a surprising omission, although Mulhall reveals in the Introduction that his original plan was to clarify Heidegger's lines of thought on this topic, in the end the latter's take on the matter is never directly discussed or examined.

For all I have said so far, it might be thought that Mulhall's collection of essays is a fairly usual contribution to the philosophical bookshelf. Nothing could be further from the truth. Each of the twelve chapters forces the reader to actively engage with the topic and not merely consider it as a theoretical possibility, as a hypothesis open for debate. The latter style of approach -- which a modern-day Socrates, the quintessential 'theoretical man' might adopt -- neatly and cleanly divides up domains and modes of inquiry, and places them in a hierarchy of value that leaves "art at the bottom and philosophy at the top" (p. 66).

This book provides an existence proof, if anything does, that this kind of dividing up is too easy. The situation is much more complex: not only are the arts and philosophy not so cleanly separated, they also have a great deal to teach one another -- especially when it comes to understanding ourselves. To appreciate the ever-shifting particularity of human selfhood requires an approach that abandons an attempt to supply theoretical generalities in favour of a "serious consideration of concrete cases" (p. xvii). Those cases -- those exemplars of individuality -- Mulhall finds in opera, film and literature.

In Alpha and Omega fashion, Wittgensteinian themes are examined in the first and final chapters, 'Exemplars of Identity' and 'Quartet'. Yet the opening chapter is not a straightforward or run-of-the-mill rehearsal or examination of the general content of Wittgenstein's remarks. Rather we are immediately confronted with questions about specific choices Wittgenstein made in that work -- about the importance of his choosing to discuss, in the original German version of the Investigations, the sword Nothung of Wagner's Ring cycle and not any other (such as Excalibur, as Anscombe's English translation has it). Mulhall argues that this choice and the details of the case make a difference to how we understand Wittgenstein's remarks about names and simples. He makes a compelling case for thinking that this subtlety matters -- one that reveals that the proper names and identity of inanimate objects might be on par with those for people, real and fictional. This discussion then moves on to take a close look at the story of Siegmund and Siegfried, where these are placed alongside and intertwined with philosophical reflections on Nietzsche's take on the links between the role of the chorus in Greek tragedy and how it is transfigured in Wagnerian opera. This then segues into a further Wittgenstein-inspired investigation into the ways in which we operate with the names of apparently historical persons -- such as Moses -- an investigation that shows how trying to draw crisp and clear boundaries between real and fictional persons is problematic and tricky.

Or, to take another case, Wittgensteinian themes are returned to in the last chapter. There the focus is on the action of a novel by David Foster Wallace -- an author who was inspired by Wittgenstein and whose narrative, which highlights issues of a challenge to identity, introduces a main character, Gramma, who in the story was taught by Wittgenstein. However, our access to Gramma's understanding of Wittgenstein's philosophy is always filtered through the perspectives of other characters in the story, for example, those of her son and her great-granddaughter. Given that these characters tend to misrepresent Wittgenstein's views in the fiction, it's unclear to what extent this is a deliberate device of the author's, or to what extent it reflects that author's own misunderstanding of those views. Matters are further complicated by the fact that a critic of Wallace's novel, Marshall Boswell, attributes a take to Wallace that is supposed to be reflected in the take that the book's characters adopt to Gramma's understanding. All of this is put under Mulhall's microscope, thus introducing the reader to a dizzying number of orders of intentionality all at once, enough to challenge even Shakespeare.

The book treats us to many other meta-fictional adventures. The fictionalized characterization of both fictional and real people is at its height in the four chapters devoted to exploring Sartrean themes in Sartrean scenes. These chapters -- 'Smoking in Wartime', 'The Gamblers of Roulettenburg', 'The Trials of Desire' and the 'The Decipherment of Signs' -- overlay, interweave and echo narrative elements and patterns from and modeled on snippets of literature and philosophy. For example, fictionalized versions of Sartre and Freud are brought into direct contact with Joseph K, and other fictionalized persons, from Kafka's The Trial. In another narrative, a fictionalized version of the young man depicted in Existentialism and Humanism returns to put a fictionalized Sartre on the spot for having previously fictionalized him.

Other chapters are more in the form of literary criticism and analysis. 'The Metaphysics of (Secret) Agency', for instance, examines how various narrative techniques and devices -- plots, character history, the use of first personal perspectives, switches of narrative style, the withholding of information from readers, placing works within wider genres, and so on -- reveal how the ways non-being-oneself exhibited by Quiller, Jason Bourne and James Bond are each quite uniquely distinctive. Still other chapters examine philosophical reflections on meta-fictional texts, for example, in 'The Melodramatic Reality of Film and Literature' Cora Diamond's and Stanley Cavell's take on J. M. Coetzee's depiction of Elizabeth Costello and her wounded 'difficulty with reality' is explored, and Costello's existential attitude is compared with that of other fictional, filmic characters. Mulhall regards this multi-faceted discussion as adding a level of complexity to his earlier study of the same texts, which sought to demonstrate "the ways in which philosophy and literature might learn something from each other" (p. 136).

It is simply impossible to capture or convey the full complexities treated in the various chapters or their individual styles of approach in a short review. I hope to have managed to give a slight glimpse and flavorful taste through the above examples. Yet one thing should be abundantly clear, even from what little I have provided: this book does not simply set out to articulate a thesis about the character of selfhood and defend it in a traditional manner. It is too self-aware to attempt anything so crude as that -- for any such attempt would seek to provide something like a general theory of the self, isolating the definitive and distinguishing properties of selves. And to proceed in that way would be to presuppose, or at least tacitly promote, the self-defeating supposition that selves are legitimate objects of study, that they are in some sense thing-like.

What lessons, then, are we meant to take away from this philosophical-cum-literary tour de force? It might seem that we are meant to conclude that selves are not things. Yet importantly, apart from exploring (as opposed to asserting) this main theme, what gives unity to Mulhall's diverse case studies is precisely that he does not present them as mere spectacles or objects of reflection meant to demonstrate a conclusion. Instead, through the various literary encounters of its many chapters, the reader is forced to come to terms with what it is to be a self mainly through engaging with the book's content and not solely through reflection on it.

In this respect the book is quite unlike monographs familiar to the analytic philosophical tradition. It is not a research publication in the standard form. But nor is it a textbook or simply a recounting of the historical ideas of long dead, famous phenomenological and existential thinkers (although some of the chapters do engage in context-setting exegesis). For the most part, it is a workbook: its literary devices are designed to function in the way Nietzsche's aphorisms do -- they are meant to engage the reader -- not by conveying a pre-packaged message in the form of a claim, but by initiating "an active critical engagement with [the] author" (p. 175). Thus the book's message is "not so much reproduced or asserted as it is enacted" (p. 175). By engaging with the literary offerings embedded in Mulhall's text, by adopting and working through a series of alternative perspectives, the reader is forced to engage in precisely the sorts of self-shifting and self-overcoming of the kind that Mulhall wishes to clarify and examine.

Does The Self and Its Shadows succeed? Surely to answer that depends on understanding what Mulhall tried to do. If I am correct in thinking that he primarily meant the book to be a tool for working on oneself rather than a vehicle for propounding and defending a specific view of the self, then how can I, as a reviewer, even begin to answer the question of its success for another? Whether Mulhall succeeded will surely depend on how the book affects you. Here I can do no better than Mulhall when he penned its closing lines, and insist: "You decide."