The Self in Question: Memory, the Body and Self-Consciousness

Placeholder book cover

Andy Hamilton, The Self in Question: Memory, the Body and Self-Consciousness, Palgrave Macmillan, 2013, 249pp., $95.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781137290403.

Reviewed by Kristina Musholt, Otto-von-Guericke Universität Magdeburg


The aim of this volume is to discuss and elucidate the relation between self-consciousness, personal identity, memory and the body. Its primary focus is on the distinctive ways we have of gaining knowledge of ourselves (as opposed to the ways in which we can gain knowledge about others), and in particular on memory and proprioception. Andy Hamilton claims that these ways of gaining self-knowledge are at the same time constitutive of personal identity (or, more precisely, that there exists what he calls a conceptual holism between memory and personal identity, as well as between proprioception and personal identity). He embeds his discussion of these ways of gaining self-knowledge and their relation to personal identity within the framework of a wider debate, namely that concerning the relation between self-consciousness and self-reference. Hamilton argues that self-consciousness cannot be understood independently from the ability to self-refer, for there also exists a conceptual holism between self-consciousness and linguistic self-reference. At the same time, in order to fully understand the first person pronoun and the way in which it is expressive of self-consciousness, "one must grasp its role both as a device of self-reference, and in eliciting the grounds of self-knowledge" (p. 2). Hence the relation between self-consciousness and personal identity.

The structure of the volume is somewhat complex, and the arguments are not always easy to follow. However, there are three key concepts around which the discussion is centered. The first of these is the notion of conceptual holism. According to Hamilton, we can diagnose conceptual holism when we find "an equivalence and interdependence between the concepts concerned, such that neither is more basic than the other: that is, a definition or understanding of concept X makes essential reference to that of concept Y, and vice versa" (p. 6).  Hamilton identifies such a conceptual holism at various points -- as already mentioned, he claims it holds between the concepts self-consciousness and linguistic self-reference as well as between proprioception and personal identity and memory and personal identity.

The second key concept is the notion of immunity to error through misidentification (IEM). A first-person ascription, such as 'I have a headache', is said to exhibit IEM when, if the subject comes to doubt the judgment for whatever reason, she cannot retreat to the claim that 'Someone has a headache'. To come to know about a headache in the relevant way (i.e., by experiencing it) is necessarily to come to know about your own headache. IEM is often held to be of crucial importance for an understanding of self-consciousness. Interestingly, while most authors tend to focus on present-tense psychological self-ascriptions, such as the judgment that 'I have a headache' or 'I see a tree in front of me' when discussing IEM, Hamilton puts it to use in emphasizing the crucial role of memory and bodily awareness for self-consciousness and personal identity. This is notable because whether memory and proprioception are indeed IEM is often contested; thus Hamilton's discussion constitutes an important contribution to the debate around IEM.

The third key concept is the concept of humanism. Although explicitly discussed only in the last chapter, it -- more or less implicitly -- underwrites much of the discussion throughout the volume. Basically, humanism, as understood by Hamilton, posits a primacy of personal over subpersonal or impersonal level explanations. Thus, a subscriber to this view will insist that explanations or thought-experiments that accord priority to a perspective that abstracts away from the personal viewpoint are fundamentally misguided. This position provides the background foil for many of the arguments presented here; it underlies, for instance, the rejection of the possibility of quasi-memory (Chapter 2) and quasi-proprioception (Chapter 4).

Chapter 1 sets up the framework for the discussion in arguing for a conceptual holism between self-consciousness and self-reference. (The relation between self-consciousness and self-reference is taken up again in Chapters 6 and 7 and thus quite literally provides the frame for Chapters 2 to 5.) Based on this holism, approaches that attempt to separate the ability for self-conscious thought from a mastery of the first person pronoun, such as José Bermúdez's (1998), are rejected. On Hamilton's view, it is a mistake to try to identify what Bermúdez calls primitive forms of self-consciousness (i.e., experiential states with nonconceptual, self-specifying content) out of which more complex, conceptual forms of self-consciousness can emerge.

However, it is not clear whether Hamilton's criticism of Bermúdez is entirely fair. For one thing, he claims that Bermúdez's appeal to the notion of self-specifying information is "non-explanatory; it can only mean first-personal" (p. 18). This seems rather quick -- at the very least such a dismissal calls for a more detailed examination of the notion of self-specifying information. Moreover, even if one agrees with Hamilton's claim of a conceptual holism between self-consciousness and linguistic self-reference, and hence of a "simultaneous acquisition" (p. 17) of the ability for self-conscious thought and the ability to use the first-person pronoun, it would still be a worthwhile question to ask how this joint, or complex, ability develops.

Chapters 2 through 5 constitute the "core debate" and have at their heart a discussion of the notion of IEM as well as of the conceptual holism between memory and personal identity on the one hand, and proprioception and personal identity on the other.

Chapter 2 aims to defend IEM as a priori, that is "as constituting a necessary connection between the remembered and remembering subject, or between the limb-owner and the limb owned" (p. 40). The significance of IEM for self-consciousness arises out of the "Distinctness Principle": in trying to understand self-consciousness, we are trying to understand a form of "thinking about oneself in a distinctive way, as subject, a way in which one cannot think of anyone or anything else" (p. 40).

According to Hamilton, in the case of present-tense self-ascriptions, such as 'I have a headache', this a priori immunity can be traced back to the fact that such ascriptions constitute avowals, and that avowals possess a complete immunity against any kind of error (not just the error of misidentification). Accordingly, these are taken to be less interesting than memory and proprioception in the context of discussing IEM. Although controversial, he doesn't defend this claim here-- as elsewhere, he refers the reader to other work for a defense, though a brief summary of the core argument would have been appreciated.

In contrast to present-tense self-ascriptions, according to Hamilton, in the case of memory there is no introspectible or avowable direct basis for IEM. Yet, there are aspects of personal remembering that "could not be reported in a third-personal way" (p. 60), that is, personal memory conforms to the Distinctness Principle, and is a priori IEM in this sense. The often-cited objection from quasi-memory -- that is, memory that appears to the subject as personal although originating in the brain-traces of a different subject -- is claimed to be untenable, because it presupposes an impersonal notion of information. Hamilton rejects this notion on the grounds that information must always be for a subject, and hence must be personal. The implication of this is that the scenario in which q-memories are thought to occur becomes in a sense incomprehensible. According to Hamilton, insofar as such a scenario is at all intelligible, it yields indeterminate results -- it becomes unclear whether we should say that the memories in question are mine or someone else's.

Although the notion of personal information is not sufficiently developed here so as to become entirely clear, the suggestion -- which is made more explicit in the last chapter -- seems to be that in thinking about self-consciousness we ought to altogether shift our perspective so that the notion of personal experience, rather than the technical/scientific notion of information that is detached from personal experience, becomes foundational. The claim seems to be that it is only when we abandon the personal viewpoint that we become susceptible to the pull of certain science-fictional scenarios, which, according to Hamilton, obscure rather than elucidate the concepts we are trying to understand. This is certainly an interesting position, though, again, more could be said to explain and defend it.

Chapter 3 defends the argument presented above against the charge of circularity. According to this charge, a definition of personal memory that rules out the possibility of q-memory must rest on a prior understanding of personal identity and so becomes circular (insofar as personal memory was meant to provide a sufficient condition for personal identity). Against this, Hamilton appeals to the aforementioned notion of conceptual holism between memory and personal identity. If we accept this holism, we can reject the assumption that either memory or personal identity must possess epistemic priority; rather, there is a mutual inter-dependence between these two concepts. Hence, the position becomes virtuously rather than viciously circular. The chapter also provides an interesting and illuminating discussion of Kant's notion of the unity of consciousness and its relevance for the present context.

A parallel line of argument is brought forward in the discussion of proprioception in Chapters 4 and 5. Chapter 4 defends the claim that my body is the body of which I have self-conscious knowledge and argues that proponents of q-proprioception, just like proponents of q-memory, "move illicitly from an impersonal, knowledge-free concept of information to an information-link in a richer, epistemic sense" (p. 133). In defending this claim Hamilton very fruitfully brings to bear insights from the phenomenological literature, in particular from Husserl and Merleau-Ponty. I found the -- rather brief -- discussion of the notion of the "lived body" (German: Leib) as opposed to the body as a physical object (German: Körper) in this context especially productive and would have liked to have delve deeper into this. Instead much of the chapter is devoted to arguing that proprioception is not a mode of perception, without it becoming entirely clear what hinges on this claim. In particular, whether or not proprioception is IEM and underlies the possibility of action -- both of which are said to render it essential to self-consciousness -- does not seem to hinge on whether or not it is a perceptual capacity. (It might instead hinge on what one takes the content of its deliverances to be.)

Chapter 5 further extends the argument against materialist accounts of bodily identity, on the grounds that these fail to acknowledge self-conscious knowledge of the body as a criterion for bodily identity, thereby failing to acknowledge the primacy of the viewpoint of the person. Parts of the chapter are also devoted to a rebuttal of Cassam's self-presentation thesis that the subject is presented to itself qua subject as a physical object. Hamilton argues that this is untenable, because for it to be coherent the thesis would require the possibility of a contrast, that is an experience that is not bodily in an IEM-exhibiting way, and this contrast is not available. Moreover, he claims that a subject that lacks experience of being embodied could not be self-conscious, or even conscious, as conscious experience requires the capacity to move (which in turn requires proprioception). However, one might think that cases of locked-in syndrome constitute counter-examples to this claim. Although Hamilton discusses these cases elsewhere in the book, he does not consider them as possible counter-examples in this context.

Chapter 6 returns to the framing discussion and reconsiders the relation between self-consciousness and self-reference. Similar to writers such as Ernst Tugendhat (1986) (though Tugendhat is not cited), Hamilton distinguishes between reference and identification, and argues -- contra Wittgenstein and Anscombe -- that although there is no genuine identification in first-person IEM judgments, such judgments must nevertheless involve self-reference, since IEM presupposes guaranteed reference of the first-person.

The chapter also considers the issue of self-location and argues that the grasp of egocentric space that is exhibited in abilities for self-location is more fundamental than mapping self-location; hence self-location cannot be explained in terms of the notion of cognitive maps.

Finally, in Chapter 7, the preceding arguments are put in the context of the doctrine of "philosophical humanism", which essentially consists in the view that "whole-person ascription involving the intentional stance is the fundamental level of explanation of human behavior" (p. 203). Humanism is contrasted both with scientism -- the view that human behavior should and can ultimately be fully explained in the terms of the physical sciences -- and with exceptionalism -- the view that humans cannot be grouped with other biological entities at any level. Indeed, humanism, on this view, does not deny the relevance of the subpersonal level for understanding human cognition. Of course, this raises the crucial question as to how exactly personal and subpersonal level explanations are related. At the same time, humanism holds that self-consciousness is paradigmatically human, which implies that animals can only possess self-consciousness in a derivative sense. Hamilton  illustrates this with the help of an extended discussion of the mirror test and its significance for self-consciousness.

Stylistically, the discussion doesn't always flow very easily. There is a certain tendency for repetition on the one hand, and for digressions on the other. Moreover, the reader is often referred to later parts of the book for explanation, or to other works altogether, when new concepts are introduced, which can at times hinder understanding. That said, any efforts to engage with this volume will certainly be rewarded. Overall, Hamilton makes an original and interesting contribution to the literature on self-consciousness. The connections that he draws between self-consciousness and personal identity, his discussion of conceptual holisms and in particular his insistence on the primacy of the viewpoint of the person are important and provide fertile grounds for future debate. Moreover, his engagement with historical accounts, in particular with regard to the phenomenological tradition, is valuable and insightful, and does much to overcome the lamentable divide between so-called continental and analytic approaches -- indeed, one would have liked to read even more of this.


Bermúdez, José Luis. 1998. The Paradox of Self-Consciousness. Cambridge: MIT Press.

Tugendhat, Ernst. 1986. Self-Consciousness and Self-Determination. Trans. by Paul Stern. Cambridge: MIT Press. (First published in German in 1979 by Suhrkamp.)