The Self: Naturalism, Consciousness, and the First-Person Stance

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Jonardon Ganeri, The Self: Naturalism, Consciousness, and the First-Person Stance, Oxford University Press, 2012, 392pp., $89.75 (hbk), ISBN 9780199652365.

Reviewed by Jan Westerhoff, Durham University


This book is hard to classify. On the one hand it is a systematic investigation of a philosophical issue that has attracted renewed attention in recent discussion: the question of the nature of the self, and its relation to "naturalism, consciousness, and the first-person stance". On the other hand it contains an enormous amount of historical material, mainly from the Ancient Indian tradition (the list of "Key philosophers discussed" lists no less than 24 Indian thinkers), which is likely to be unfamiliar to the general philosophical reader. It would be unfair to consider it a work in comparative philosophy: Ganeri's chief interest is not to discuss differences and similarities between Ancient Indian and Modern Western conceptions of the self. Yet it is often said that one of the key aims of the comparative philosophical enterprise is to think about familiar problems in a new light, and this aim is admirably fulfilled by Ganeri's book.

This is particularly clear in his "analytical taxonomy" of theories of the self (35-49). In examining Indian theoretical views of the self he succeeds in constructing a conceptual map that moves beyond the familiar "big three": Cartesianism, Materialism, and Humean Reductionism. He does so by examining two important concepts Indian sources employ in thinking about mental states. The first is the idea of a "place" (ādhāra), which provides an answer to the question what a mental state is a state of. The second is the idea of a "basis" (āśraya), answering the question what a mental state existentially depends on. In the case of the familiar three views these dimensions do not come apart. For the Cartesian the immaterial self is both the place that owns the mental states as well as their metaphysical basis. For the Materialist and the Reductionist the body and the stream of consciousness, respectively, play similar roles. But once we realize that these two dimensions can come apart (and frequently do so in Indian discussions) a whole new array of possible positions for thinking about the self presents itself to us.

There is, for example, the view of the Abhidharma Buddhist, which takes the body to be the metaphysical basis, but denies that there is any place: mental states have no owner. The Advaita Vedāntin, on the other hand, holds the self to be the place, the owner of mental states, but denies the existence of any basis: experience, understood in its ultimate forms as pure consciousness is not existentially dependent on anything. By coupling the notions of place and basis with those of self, body, and stream, Ganeri arrives at a classification of eleven possible conceptions of the self and argues that necessarily, every theory of the self falls under at least one of them. This provides us with an extremely useful framework for thinking about the problem of the self, not to mention its utility in charting the interconnections between the various theories of body, self, and mental events we find in classical Indian sources.

Ganeri is of course not merely interested in producing a taxonomy. Rather, his aim is to put together what he regards as the most sophisticated views of the self the Indian tradition has to offer and to forge a new one, a view that is not just historically informed, but also systematically defensible. He sees himself indebted primarily to three philosophical sources of thinking about the self: the Ancient Indian Cārvāka materialists, the Buddhists, and the Classical Indian school of Navya-Nyāya. He uses the discussion of the Cārvāka materialists to present a new theory of emergence in terms of transformation (this school is well known for comparing the arising of mental phenomena from physical states to that of intoxicating power derived from fermenting yeast). The Buddhist discussion constitutes a detailed phenomenological investigation of self-consciousness, together with the idea of an "underself", a set of proto-intentional processes that jointly come together to bring about experience. Ganeri's appeal to Nyāya contributes an analysis of mental states as supervening on the body and a version of "minimal physicalism" that is compatible with free will and autonomous agency. At the same time he finds plenty to disagree with in each of these approaches. He rejects the Cārvāka view of first-person phenomena as impoverished and does not want to take on board the Buddhist error-theory regarding first-person thought, or the Nyāya view of the eternality of the self. There is no problem with such disagreements, however, since Ganeri is not engaged in a task of rationally reconstructing a historical position. His aim is rather to do philosophy with Ancient Indian texts, using their detailed discussion as sources of inspiration and ultimately as shoulders of giants. Standing on them a new philosophical view emerges: dependent in important ways on their insights but not identical with any of them.

The view Ganeri sets out to defend, and which is conceived of as a position that combines the best features of the three approaches just discussed is a version of what he calls an "ownership view" of the self. It is a view where the metaphysical basis of our mental states is the body, yet their place, their owner, is the self. Ganeri insists that this view constitutes a naturalistic conception of the self, but one that is naturalistic in a liberal sense: it treads a middle path between on the one hand reducing selves to what happens in our brains, and on the other ascribing to them any possibility of a disembodied existence. The notion of naturalism appealed to here does not refer to the nature of physics, but takes its roots in more ancient conceptions, relating to what is "in our nature" as human beings. This notion of nature is the subject of investigation when we inquire into the notion of the self, the proper domain of a "normative special science", not of physics or neurobiology.

According to the picture Ganeri presents, the self is supervenient on but not reducible to a set of unconscious processes that characterize the "underself", unconscious mechanisms such as comparison, information retrieval, self-monitoring and so on. As such the view faces the challenges of any theory relying on multiple-domain supervenience, for example, the peculiar variety of Cartesians discussed by Jaegwon Kim who hold that there are both physical and mental substances, but that the character of the latter supervenes on the former. A key issue that arises here is the notion of simplicity: why postulate two things if we can make do with one? Ganeri's careful discussion of this criticism points out that, though important, considerations of simplicity are hardly decisive on their own. We would only want to appeal to them ceteris paribus, that is in cases where we have two theories that explain some subject-matter equally well. But it is far from clear that we can achieve that situation in the present case. If the arguments in favour of the view that mental properties cannot be properties of any physical system are sufficiently weighty, considerations of simplicity may not be sufficient to win the day for single-domain supervenience. Ganeri discusses a set of such arguments due to the sixth-century thinker Praśastapāda that underline the high explanatory price a view that regards mental properties as simply properties of the physical body will incur.

The resulting ownership theory of the self shows it to possess three dimensions: the underlying underself, essentially an unconscious monitoring of mental states, an immersed self, responsible for the first-person presentation of conscious content, and a participant self, involving roles of participation and endorsement. All three are necessary, and without any one of them the phenomenology of a non-pathological view of the self cannot be seen to emerge. The self is unified as a unit of coordination, immersion, and participation.

One particularly noteworthy feature of this book is that Ganeri manages the amazing feat of writing for two different audiences at once. One is Western-trained philosophers looking for answers to the puzzling questions the various properties of the self. They will find a thorough and sophisticated discussion that at the same time introduces them to a stunning set of intellectual gems from India's philosophical history. The second audience consists of scholars working on Ancient Indian materials dealing with the relation of body, mind, and self. Even though the discussion is going to be considerably more hard-going for this audience, they will find new insights into ways of thinking about the Ancient Indian discussion and the interrelation between various philosophical traditions on almost every page. The ease with which Ganeri manages to keep both audiences on board without sacrificing either philosophical sophistication, or distorting the nuances of the historical discussion by broad-brush generalizations found in less accomplished works on cross-cultural philosophical debates is nothing less than astonishing. It is no exaggeration to say that this book marks the beginning of a completely new phase in the study of Indian philosophy, one in which a firm grasp of the historical material forms the basis for going beyond pure exegesis, opening up the way for doing philosophy with ancient sources.