The Self-Organizing Social Mind

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John Bolender, The Self-Organizing Social Mind, foreword by Alan Page Fiske, MIT Press, 2010, xiv + 190pp., $32.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780262014441.

Reviewed by Georg Theiner, University of Vienna


Sociability is one of the most fascinating traits of our species. As human beings, we create and participate in complex social structures with a flexibility of group membership which is unparalleled in the animal kingdom, and we are capable of entertaining a seemingly endless variety of social relationships. What if underneath our dappled social world lies a deeper kind of simplicity, which can be explained by the physics of symmetry and its breakings, akin to the processes which are at work in the formation of a snowflake or a spiral galaxy? In his insightful new book, John Bolender argues that such a view is indeed suggested by contemporary science rather than a figment of social romanticism.

Bolender's discussion builds on the work of cognitive anthropologist Alan Page Fiske (1991, 1992, 2004), who has provided considerable evidence that people rely on four elementary cognitive schemata ('models') to structure and coordinate most of their social relationships most of the time in all cultures (click here for an overview). According to Fiske's Relational Models Theory (RMT), those four models are: (1) communal sharing (CS), a relationship in which people of the same group are treated as equivalent and undifferentiated; (2) authority ranking (AR), a relationship in which people are ordered in some linear hierarchy; (3) equality matching (EM), in which social relationships are monitored for balance, including a knowledge of what is needed to restore such balance if it is lost; and (4) market pricing (MP), in which relationships between people are structured by proportions such as prices, wages, interests, or more generally, cost-benefit analyses. Many of our everyday interactions clearly involve more than one model, of course; for instance, customers at a supermarket queue up (EM) to pay at the cashier's for their items (MP), one of which is a gift for a loved one (CS). Part of the undeniable appeal ('beauty,' as Bolender is fond of saying) of RMT is thus its promise to explain our ability to engage in complex social interactions by combining, and also recursively embedding, just those four types of social-relational models.

Moreover, as Fiske (1991) already noted, the four basic models are homologous to the four basic levels of measurement (nominal, ordinal, interval, and ratio scale) and thus form a descending, nested series with successively fewer degrees of uniqueness (i.e., fewer 'admissible' transformations which preserve the same information). For instance, as we move from CS to AR, the numbers we put on people (or groups of people) preserve ordinality (over and above equality), but are indifferent with respect to their interval differences (which would be required for EM). The king must be served more pancakes than the prince, but it doesn't matter how many more pancakes he is served. As for each scale type, we can thus equally characterize each type of model by distinguishing the 'transformations' of a social situation that make a social difference from those which don't.

Bolender deserves full credit for unveiling another layer of 'beauty' within RMT. His main insight is that the notion of uniqueness, as used in measurement theory, corresponds to the concept of symmetry used in physics and, derivatively, complexity science (i.e., the general study of pattern formation). At first blush, this may seem like a technicality; but Bolender skillfully fleshes out its potentially far-reaching implications for the study of human sociality. Complexity science is a productive melee of ideas and techniques borrowed mostly from statistical physics, information theory, and non-linear dynamics. Speaking very generally, it explains the emergence of complexity out of greater homogeneity as the loss ('breaking') of symmetry. In non-equilibrium systems, tiny fluctuations ('noise') acting on the system at critical points can abruptly result in dramatic and seemingly 'spontaneous' losses of symmetry by determining which branch of a bifurcation is taken. 'Spontaneous' does not mean uncaused, of course; it only means that there is no information flow across a system's boundaries that 'encodes' or otherwise 'prescribes' its internal dynamics -- a feature of complex systems known as self-organization. With each bifurcation, the system is driven further away from equilibrium. When symmetries break in a system, which happens in a determinable order, the resulting symmetry group is a subgroup of the previous group, similar to the nested hierarchy of scale types that is homologous to Fiske's models. Consequently, the fact that Fiske's four elementary models also form a descending chain of symmetry subgroups strongly suggests, says Bolender, that they are also due to a sequence of spontaneous symmetry breakdowns. (In fact, Bolender speculates -- true to form -- that there must be a fifth elementary model that is maximally symmetric (pp. 104-11). He calls it 'oceanic merging,' and identifies it with the trance-like state that is characteristically associated with experiences of a 'mystical union' with all of humanity, or even the entire cosmos.)

This prompts the question: what explains the spontaneous symmetry breakings of the basic social-relational models? Going one step beyond Fiske in 'cognitivising' sociality, Bolender suggests that they are produced by (in fact, identical with; p. 120) spontaneous symmetry breakings in the firing patterns of a single neural network in the brain -- a 'social pattern generator' (SPG; cf. pp. 28, 60, 95-104; 120-21; 125-30). Bolender presents his bold conjecture as an inference to the simplest explanation, analogous to the familiar claim that there are central pattern generators (CPGs) in the brain which drive the production of rhythmic motor behaviors such as locomotion, respiration, or swallowing:

The shift from hierarchical feudal authority structures to free-market capitalism is very much like the shift from trot to gallop in a horse. It is a loss of certain symmetries while others remain. But the crucial symmetry breaking in humans is not occurring in society itself any more than the crucial symmetry breaking in the horse occurs in its legs. In both cases, the relevant broken symmetry is found in the central nervous system. (p. 60)

Anybody with the chutzpah to inject such brave new analogies into the venerable world of social science is bound to come under attack on multiple fronts. Many anthropologists and historians steeped in humanistic traditions will no doubt be appalled by this overtly reductionist idiom. But of course we ought to bear in mind that Bolender's claim is intended as a theoretically motivated hypothesis about the proximate mechanisms of social-relational cognition, not as a description of how the effects of those mechanisms play out over the long haul in concrete historical circumstances. Similarly, there is no reason to think that from a first-person perspective, switching from, say, AR to MP would 'seem like' a difference in neural firing patterns. Cognitive science aims to discover the principles and mechanisms underlying mental information-processing, and its methods do not require that people ought to be able to become introspectively aware of those mechanisms (pp. 99-100). From a different perspective, (cognitive) neuroscientists may be tempted to chastise Bolender for not telling us where exactly in the brain we should look for the SPG, but I believe this criticism would be premature. As the author self-consciously admits, his hypothesis is purely speculative at this point (p. 100). Bolender's modest yet valuable goal is to flesh out a 'job description' for the SPG that can act as a guide to future scientific discovery (p. 160). In this respect, the analogy with CPGs is well-taken, because CPGs have also been defined functionally in terms of what they do rather than on the basis of any specific physiological or anatomical criteria (p. 38). Finally, a Platonist might object that Bolender is 'psychologizing' the abstract mathematical objects which are expressed in Fiske's models by stuffing them into the brains of mere mortals (Chapter 6). Fair enough, but even if we relegate the study of social-relational models as Platonic forms to certain branches of pure mathematics (e.g., scaling theory), Bolender has a point that we'd still have to explain how those abstract objects 'are grasped by the mind thanks to biological processes in the brain' (p. 154). Hence at least we'd have two distinct yet compatible explanatory projects on our hands.

In light of these responses, I tend to agree with Bolender that the best way to argue for the reality of the hypothesized SPG is to show that it would have some indispensable causal-explanatory work to do (within the context of RMT). But contra Bolender, I don't really see what kind of work that would be.

To begin with, why should we look primarily inside the head at all? To be sure, Bolender's analysis of Fiske's models in terms of symmetry-breakings adds significant generality and depth to RMT. It suggests that the emergence of social complexity may be fundamentally of the same ilk as the familiar ordering processes that we find in a much wider and superficially diverse class of physical systems, including inorganic ones. Taking a 'complex systems stance' towards RMT won't provide us with a detailed theory of sociality, but it certainly invites us to search for inductively fertile generalizations across physics, biology, linguistics, cognitive science, social science, and anthropology which still our hunger for 'consilience' (Wilson, 1998). However, why not primarily look into social dynamics, rather than brain dynamics, to explain the observed symmetry breakdowns (Nelson, 2005)? Although he does not explicitly say so, Bolender pursues a strongly 'individualist' and/or 'internalist' agenda, in the sense that (1) social phenomena should ultimately be explained in terms of the psychological states of individual agents and (2) psychological states should ultimately be explained in terms of intrinsic neural properties of those individuals (Wilson, 2004). This agenda may be driven by Bolender's favoritism for 'endogeneous' over 'exogeneous' (e.g., functionalist) explanations, but we should be clear that an appetite for 'endogeneous' accounts need not imply an endorsement of individualism or internalism. From Hobbes to Marx to contemporary econophysics, there is a large family of scientific traditions -- recently grouped together under the umbrella term 'physics of society' (Ball, 2004) -- which investigate how complex patterns of social, political, and economic behavior can form 'spontaneously' from the interactions of a great many individuals, guided only by simple, local, and idiosyncratic concerns.

Importantly, the success of these 'physics-based' models of how people acting en masse join groups, form allegiances, collaborate, make decisions, cast votes, form social hierarchies, establish companies, and other things, does not hinge on positing any corresponding 'social pattern generators' in their brains. In fact, in many cases, the emergent effects of their collective behavior are unintended and may go unnoticed by individual agents, even if sophisticated cognitive agents like us certainly have the capacity to represent them if we become aware of them. So here's a 'mixed' counter-proposal to the SPG which combines physics-based and selection-based factors (very similar to the one proposed by Alan P. Fiske, in his Foreword). First, the 'physics of society' itself may be sufficient to produce the nested symmetry subgroups that are reflected in the four elementary models. But even if those patterns can 'spontaneously' arise, on a cultural-historical scale, it seems likely that over time, they would become further stabilized (or, at times, disrupted) by the familiar processes of biological and cultural evolution. And there is nothing mysterious in thinking that those patterns can be learned or become partly hardwired into our brains if their detection was sufficiently important for our survival.

Looking inside the brain, how does Bolender conceive of the relationship between SPG and RMT? He seems to view RMT as a kind of 'competence' theory (in Chomsky's sense), which has to be combined with various 'performance' theories of how those models are conceptualized and implemented in concrete, culture-specific social situations (pp. 65-81). Importantly, SPG is not meant as a full replacement of RMT in this role. Although Bolender employs the language of complexity theory to analyze the dynamics of phase transitions in Fiske's models, he sharply dissociates himself from so-called 'radical' dynamicists in cognitive science (cf. Chemero, 2009) who utterly eschew the use of representational-cum-computational theories of cognition (pp. 77f). This is no doubt motivated by his belief that RMT, similar to the language faculty, exhibits the property of 'discrete infinity' (pp. 69-78). Bolender thus seems committed to view RMT as a computational module of the mind which operates on mental representations with numeral-like properties, capable of producing semantically evaluable models of social-relational structure (pp. 78; 112-21). In this case, what exactly is the SPG supposed to contribute to its operation?

One might argue that the SPG is the source of, or perhaps even the primary representational vehicle of, distinctively social-relational content. But this option seems to be a non-starter, as Bolender is quick to point out that the four (or five) patterns of oscillatory activity produced by the SPG do not have any intrinsic representational content (p. 97). The social content of the outputs of the SPG is said to be wholly derived from its interactions with other mental faculties (p. 97), in particular what Fiske calls 'preos' (i.e., socially transmitted prototypes, precedents, and principles; p. 66). (So shouldn't we speak of a generic scale type generator rather than a social pattern generator?) Instead, Bolender claims that SPG patterns constitute the 'core causal factors' (p. 130) which explain the formal properties of the elementary models, as represented by RMT, and thereby add metaphysical 'necessity' and also 'beauty' to the core of human sociality (pp. 2-3; 7). As far as I can see, Bolender offers two models of what type of 'explanation' this would amount to. Let's consider each of them in turn.

First, we have already said that Bolender compares the role of the SPG to the presumed causal role of a CPG (pp. 96f; 36-39). For instance, it can be shown that the familiar quadrupedal gaits form a descending chain of symmetry groups, and there is evidence that those gait patterns are (at least in part) driven by symmetry-breaking bifurcations spontaneously occurring in a network of neural oscillators located in the spinal cord. The basic 'segments' of motor behavior produced by the CPG serve as a kind of 'vocabulary' from which more complex, goal-oriented locomotory behaviors can be assembled 'on demand' by higher-level cognitive functions inside the brain, mutatis mutandis for the SPG. But there is an important asymmetry here. The hypothesized causal effects of the SPG on the production of interpersonally relevant behavior are essentially mediated by their social-relational content, whereas the causal effects of the CPG on our bodies is not. The motor patterns 'endogenously' created by the CPG don't have to be formally or semantically interpretable as 'mental representations' at all to do their job (Kelso, 1995), as long as the CPG is causally hooked up in the right way with our limbs to be able to affect the timing of muscular contractions. Why would this make a difference? As Bolender points out (pp. 96f), the CPG can only form one pattern at a time, but that's fine because a horse cannot trot and gallop at the same time. A CPG doesn't have to 'represent' trotting unless its current state is directly implicated in trotting behavior. However, it's a problem that the SPG can only produce one social-relational model at a time, because we can surely represent more than one such model at a time, e.g., when we compare two models to decide in what type of social interaction we should engage (pp. 96f).

Bolender tries to get around this problem by comparing the SPG to a mental 'lexicon' as posited by linguists. Just like items from the lexicon must be 'copied' when they are accessed by the mental syntax, the patterns created by the SPG must be 'copied' to serve as input to other faculties where they can be processed further, such as in the formation of complex mental representations. But if those 'patterns' can be readily transformed into a more permanently accessible and freely re-combinable format, why not simply store them in the brain as such? At least we could 'retire' the SPG after it has done one full 'swoop' through its phases during cognitive development. However, the 'one-and-done' interpretation can't be what Bolender has in mind, because he thinks that -- analogous to the CPG -- we can't engage in X-type social interactions unless the SPG is in X-mode at that very moment (p. 126). I find this implausible. The CPG is a lower-level mechanism of rhythmic motor coordination that can be recruited by higher-level cognitive functions, e.g., when a horse decides to engage in predator-avoiding behavior. If you 'knock out' the horse's CPG, it won't be able to gallop in order to flee, because the causal chain running from the brain to the limbs via the CPG has been broken. However, the output of the SPG must first be 'copied' into higher-level representational modules whose operation, in turn, accounts for how we behave in social interactions. Hence if we knock out the SPG after its pattern of activity has been copied into the RMT, this should not directly affect our subsequent social behavior, as long as the relevant copies are somehow preserved further downstream.

But there is a potentially bigger lacuna, considering that the main function of the relational models is to underpin the social coordination of people. If my SPG does not represent others as potentially interacting subjects (in a given social context), and yet operates in a mandatory and involuntary fashion like a cognitive module, how are your actions and mine coordinated? For instance, what if my SPG is set on engaging in generous acts of EM, while yours is phase-locked into AR? A possible non-representational way of achieving social coordination is by mutual entrainment, i.e., the tendency of coupled oscillators to fall into step that is widely observed in mechanical and biological systems. It has been shown that, even in the absence of mechanical couplings, the temporal coordination of movement patterns across perceptually coupled individuals follows many of the same dynamical principles which govern the intra-personal coordination of limbs (Schmidt, Carello, & Turvey, 1990; Schmidt et al., in press). For instance, people tend to become entrained to each other in their body and eye movements, gestures, speech patterns, and rhythmic hand movements like clapping, and their motor coordination tends to increase their affiliation and understanding of each other, as well as their willingness to cooperate.

However, recent evidence also suggests that the extent to which entrainment occurs is modulated by the participants' shared task representations, joint planning, and other higher-level cognitive processes of social cognition which service the interpersonal coordination of actions (Knoblich, Butterfill, & Sebanz, in press). Similarly, the contextually articulated social-relational models can reliably structure our interpersonal behavior only if they are able, on occasion, to 'break up' and 'override' the lower-level processes of rhythmic motor entrainment. But short of telepathy, it remains unclear how the social entrainment of individual SPGs would work in the absence of any obvious perceptual channels; otherwise, the notion of 'entrainment' seems to be used purely metaphorically for any sort of conceptual alignment. In sum, the implementation of RMT calls for a host of psychological capacities whose representational and causal job description is quite unlike what is asked of a CPG, and this weakens the putative analogy with the SPG.

Second, Bolender compares the role of the innate SPG to the presumed role of 'economy conditions' in contemporary formulations of generative linguistics (pp. 52-57; 160). In particular, Chomsky and others have argued that the basic rules of syntactic transformation ('movements') follow from universal computational constraints that can be characterized in terms of 'least action' principles, such as 'move the smallest object possible, the shortest distance possible.' For Chomsky, who has always been a staunch defender of the formal autonomy of syntax vis-à-vis the pragmatics of language use, those 'least action' principles are not innate because they have been selected for their functionality, but because they are directly implied by more fundamental 'least action' principles in physics. Bolender takes Chomsky's conjecture as a license to speculate that the functionality of the SPG may be similarly implied by (brain) physics rather than because it is encoded in the genome -- a brand of 'non-genomic nativism' (p. 96). Of course the reason why Chomsky's renegade view sits uneasily with the 'Darwin-boosting' camp of generative linguists, notably Pinker and Jackendoff, is that nobody has the slightest clue about how to derive those economy principles from deeper principles of physics (p. 56). This contrasts with our knowledge of naïve physics (like 'water finds its own level'), which we know how to derive from general principles of energy minimization in theoretical physics. In response to Pinker and Jackendoff, Bolender points out that we don't know that they are not derivable from physics and that his hypothesis is, at best, only meant to provide a starting point for further discoveries (p. 56).

I am not exactly satisfied by this reply, depending on how high we set the bar for Bolender's reasoning from analogy. Does it merely serve to establish the fairly weak claim that (A) the current lack of evidence for a 'physics-based' derivation of linguistic economy principles is in principle consistent with the ultimate truth of the SPG hypothesis? If so, we can agree, lest we be guilty of an appeal to ignorance. But the more interesting conclusion would surely follow if (B) the evidence for 'physics-based' derivations of linguistic economy principles would strongly suggest the SPG hypothesis. On this front, sheer optimism won't do the trick. On the contrary, the plausibility of the Chomsky-Bolender brand of nativism may be weakened by the comparative success of a prominent 'empiricist' competitor for a unified representational theory of brain function. I am specifically referring to 'Bayesian Brain' theory (Friston, 2003; 2005), according to which brains are hierarchically organized statistical inference machines operating via recurrent cascades of 'predictive coding.' On each level of this hierarchy, the function of the brain is to minimize the error in predicting its next input, based on its internal model of what external states are causing that input. Running this (essentially Bayesian) predictive coding regime long enough is, in principle, bound to produce accurate models of the 'signal source' which, ultimately, reflect the (organism-relevant) statistical properties of the world.

Using the concept of 'free energy' as a measure of the discrepancy between the external world and its internal representation, Friston (2009) has recently argued that the 'Bayesian Brain' hypothesis can be derived from fundamental principles governing the behavior of living systems. The 'Bayesian Brain' story is in principle general enough to encompass generative models of language, including a Chomskyan 'principles and parameters' approach to language acquisition. Language-specific parameters can be set as a result of Bayesian learning, and innate linguistic principles correspond to what Friston calls 'hyper-priors' that might have become hardwired into the human brain, perhaps through a process of Baldwinian evolution. But of course this is essentially an 'empiricist' story about how internal models are learned as a result of an organism's interactions with its environment, together with a functionalist story about how the brain is biologically well-adapted to minimize prediction error through moving, sensing, acting, and thinking. Hence it does not lend support to Bolender's vision of a 'non-genomic nativism.'

Despite my doubts that an SPG is the best possible explanation of the fundamental forms of social relations, there is much to admire about the creative audacity of Bolender's book. It is written by a keen observer of fundamental patterns that run throughout nature in its physical, cognitive, and social manifestations, firmly grounded in scientific fact, and defended with great vigor. Pick up the book -- it's great advertising for taking a 'complex systems' stance towards sociality in general, and RMT in particular.[1]


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[1] Thanks to John Bolender and Alan P. Fiske for valuable feedback on an earlier draft of this review. Needless to say, the reviewer is fully responsible for any remaining inadequacies or errors in his presentation.