The Semantics of Analogy: Rereading Cajetan's De Nominum Analogia

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Joshua P. Hochschild, The Semantics of Analogy: Rereading Cajetan's De Nominum Analogia, University of Notre Dame Press, 244pp., $35.00 (pbk.), ISBN 9780268030919.

Reviewed by E. Jennifer Ashworth, University of Waterloo



This lucid but somewhat limited study is an account of Cajetan’s short work, De nominum analogia (On the analogy of names). After successfully refuting a number of earlier inaccurate accounts of the work’s nature and importance, Hochschild gives a useful extended paraphrase and explanation of the work’s contents. In so doing, he raises a number of interesting issues about late medieval semantics which call for further exploration.

Tommaso de Vio, Cardinal Cajetan (1468 [or 1469 by the revised calendar] - 1534) was an Italian member of the Dominican order who was active in teaching, writing, and church politics. He wrote many commentaries, including one on Aquinas’s Summa theologiae which is included in the Leonine edition of the Summa, and another on Aristotle’s De anima which aroused much controversy concerning the immortality of the soul, whose demonstrative proof Cajetan came to hold to be impossible. He is also known for his debates with Martin Luther when he was papal legate in Germany. In certain contexts, he is most famous for a short early work devoted to the analogy of names, written in 1498, but not published until 1506. This work grew out of his commentary on Aristotle’s Categories, whose initial division of names into equivocal (or homonymous), univocal (or synonymous) and denominative (or paronymous) had led to extended discussion in logic texts of the problem of analogical terms. These discussions were very closely related to similar discussions in commentaries on Aristotle’s Sophistical Refutations, Physics and Metaphysics, as well as to the problem of the divine names in theology.

Very roughly, the issue of analogy arose from reflection on the extended use of such words as ‘healthy’ when used of food and medicine as opposed to animals. Early accounts of equivocity had made a division between pure equivocals, such as ‘dog’ used of barking animals, marine animals, and heavenly bodies, where the different senses are not linked, and deliberate equivocals such as ‘healthy’ where they are. These terms came to be called analogical. Medieval thinkers then asked how the word ‘being’ when said of substance and accidents or of God and creatures should be classified. Was it univocal, as Duns Scotus came to hold, or purely equivocal, as he held in his earlier writings, or was it analogical? If the latter, then is it to be distinguished from such words as ‘healthy’? Cajetan is concerned to show that such words as ‘being’ and ‘good’ are analogical, but not in the way that deliberate equivocals are analogical. It is here that he introduces his important distinction between the analogy of attribution, in which senses are related by priority and posteriority, and the analogy of proportionality, which relies on the comparison of two relations, or, he would prefer to say, the foundation of two relations. Thus if I say that food is healthy, I use analogy by attribution, for food is healthy insofar as it brings about the health of an animal, but if I call both substances and accidents beings, I am normally using analogy in its most proper sense, by evoking a comparison between the foundation of existence in a substance and its foundation in an accident.

Cajetan’s account of the analogy of proportionality is complicated by three assumptions which characterize medieval semantics. First, spoken words (and written words, albeit indirectly) signify both concepts and things, where things for non-nominalists were common natures (however these were to be construed). It should be noted here that although Hochschild frequently speaks as if signification is the same as meaning, this is not the case: the two notions cannot be precisely mapped onto each other, although there are obvious relations between them. Second, spoken words acquire their signification by an original act of institution, or imposition as it was called. Third, the things signified by univocal terms must fall within the categories, either directly by signifying genera, species and so on, or indirectly by signifying a relation between categorial items. The latter remark pertains to denominative terms such as ‘white’, which in some way signifies both the accident whiteness and the substance which possesses it. This third condition seemed to exclude such transcendental terms as ‘being’ (ens) and ‘good’ (bonum) from being univocal, and hence was abandoned by Scotus.

In the second half of the thirteenth century logicians began to worry about how analogical terms could be produced by imposition, and how they could be related to concepts. If an analogical term corresponds to two concepts, were there two acts of imposition or one act of imposition and an extension by virtue of usage, and how is the relationship between the concepts captured? If an analogical term corresponds to one concept by one act of imposition, is this concept simple or complex? Can a simple concept include priority and posteriority? Can a complex concept really be captured by one act of imposition? These questions were further complicated by the introduction of the distinction between formal concepts, or acts of mind, and objective concepts, the cognized contents of the formal concepts. Cajetan has very little to say about the origin of analogical terms, though he argues (§115) that nearly all terms analogical by proportion are like the word ‘wisdom’ which was first imposed to signify human wisdom, and was extended to signify the wisdom of God, so that it was univocal said of us, but analogical said of God and us. Cajetan’s main discussion is directed towards formal and objective concepts and he is particularly intent upon showing that the analogy of proportionality involves concepts with a unity which is sufficient for predication, definition, comparison and knowledge (scientia) while not being the strict unity required for univocity.

In his study of De nominum analogia, Hochschild sets out to do two things. First, he demolishes what he describes as an outdated paradigm concerning the interpretation of Cajetan’s work. This paradigm, adopted by many Thomists in the twentieth century, began with the assumption that Cajetan intended to present an account of Aquinas’s doctrine of analogy, and that his distinctions between the analogy of attribution and the analogy of proportionality depended on metaphysical considerations. Using recent research on the background to Cajetan, Hochschild argues convincingly and at length that this paradigm is simply wrong. Cajetan never intended to present an account of Aquinas, even if he followed the standard procedure of backing up his own views by inserting references to passages in Aquinas. Rather, he was attacking the views of some fifteenth-century Thomists, but also, and most importantly, the views of Scotus. Moreover, while metaphysical beliefs certainly lie behind his account of analogical terms, his intention, as demonstrated by the very title of the book, is semantic. He is concerned with names, their meaning and use.

Second, Hochschild gives an explanation and what amounts to a paraphrase of Cajetan’s distinctions and arguments in their order of presentation. In so doing, he hopes to show that Cajetan focused on the problem of avoiding equivocation in inferences, and that he was sensitive to context in a way that many preceding logicians had not been. Hochschild’s actual explanation and paraphrase is good, in that he writes clearly, and has meditated deeply on Cajetan’s text. However, he still leaves me confused about the precise arithmetic of concepts that Cajetan adopted, as is perhaps inevitable given the various apparently incompatible claims that Cajetan makes. Sometimes the word ‘being’ seems to correspond to just one objective concept, but viewed from another angle it seems to correspond to more than one. Leaving that problem aside, I would like to consider Hochschild’s two general claims about Cajetan, starting with the one concerning equivocation.

In trying to support this claim, Hochschild bases his arguments on his belief that "Cajetan’s De Nominum Analogia is fruitfully read as an answer" (p. 44) to the “Scotistic challenge to the semantic possibility of analogy” (p. 79). Hochschild reads this challenge as having to do with Scotus’s definition of a univocal term as one with sufficient unity to avoid the fallacy of equivocation when it is used in inference, a definition which allowed Scotus to argue for the univocity of ‘being’. An answer to the challenge involves showing that the analogy of proportionality has sufficient unity to avoid equivocation. Hochschild further claims (p. 138) that “Scotus and his followers had argued against the possibility of analogy in metaphysics by denying the semantic possibility of analogical signification.” In fact, this ignores what seems to me to be Scotus’s main innovation, which was precisely to divorce metaphysics from semantics. His arguments against analogical terms, as found in his logical commentaries, have to do both with the impossibility of imposition of the sort required and with the absence of concepts of the appropriate sort, and it is not at all clear that Scotus rejected metaphysical analogy. He simply believed that we cannot expect individual terms and concepts to mirror the world, even if we have ways of expressing analogical relations, just as we have ways of speaking about a transcendent God. It was not Cajetan who was “unprecedented in keeping logical or semantic considerations separate from metaphysical ones” (p. 116), but Scotus.

Be that as it may, it is not clear to me that Cajetan was as focused on the problem of the fallacy of equivocation as Hochschild claims. Cajetan does take up the issue of equivocation and fallacy in chapter 10, but he devotes as much space to the long-standing problem of comparison, which arose from Aristotelian texts suggesting (a) that beings could be compared and (b) that only univocals could be compared. Nor does he say that his reason for rejecting earlier views about the types of unity an analogical term may involve have to do directly with their not providing an answer to the problem of equivocation. Moreover, if one takes seriously Cajetan’s claim that the word ‘being’ can be analogical both by attribution and by proportionality, a claim which Hochschild happily endorses, one immediately gets a new problem of equivocation, for before one can assess the truth of a judgment about being, one must know in which sense the term is being used.

Hochschild’s second claim is about Cajetan’s sensivity to context, and here he is particularly concerned to defend Cajetan against holding “the naive semantic assumptions” that I have “detected in other medieval authors” (p. 117) according to which terms are analogical independently of their use. One aspect of relation to use is origin, for if an analogical term is produced by imposition, its status will indeed be analogical independent of use. Another aspect of relation to use is the complicated question of context, where context may embrace both intra and extra-sentential considerations. Leaving supposition theory aside, since it concerned the range of reference of terms whose signification was already established, there were two particularly important places for the discussion of context in medieval logic texts. First, there is the discussion in Categories commentaries of whether univocal terms can also be equivocal or analogical. Scotus rejected the view that all univocal terms could be equivocal, even arguing that Aristotle’s example of ‘animal’ said of a man and a painted image was not an example of equivocity. On the other hand, Paul of Venice thought that while some terms of second intention such as ‘univocal’ could only be univocal, all terms of first intention could be both univocal and deliberately equivocal. Cajetan seems to hold that terms could be both univocal and analogical (§115), but he does not explicitly discuss the general issue.

Second, there is the discussion in commentaries on the Categories and on the Sophistical Refutations of whether equivocal terms need to be disambiguated in all intra-sentential contexts. Again, various views were held. On one extreme, we find the doctrine that the original imposition of a term such as ‘healthy’ includes the condition that in some contexts it must be taken in its primary sense and in others distinctions must be made. On the other extreme, we find the doctrine that pragmatic considerations may indicate how an equivocal term is to be taken, but that no intra-sentential context can remove its equivocity. Again, there is only the vaguest hint of these discussions in Cajetan. He refers in passing (§16) to the often-quoted principle that an unmodified analogical term is taken in the best known sense; he remarks (§22) on the necessity to make distinctions in the case of terms analogical by attribution; and at the end of the book (§125) he warns readers that they should consider the occasion of utterance (sermonis causam), but further than that he does not go. He may well have been sensitive to context in his practice, but it was not a subject of theoretical interest for him as it had been for many of his medieval predecessors.

Hochschild’s discussion of the above issues would have gained from a more extensive scholarship. He relies too heavily on quotations in secondary sources for his references to the people who most influenced Cajetan and against whom he was probably arguing. He does not pay attention to the abundant recent literature on medieval semantics which would cast light on the background to developments after Aquinas. Nor does he consider the authors of commentaries on the Categories who were being read and published in late fifteenth-century Italy, including Paul of Venice, Walter Burley and Cajetan’s own (probable) teacher, Paulus Soncinas (d. 1495), whose commentary was published postumously in 1499, but must have circulated in manuscript. Some of the points Cajetan made were far from novel. For instance, his discussion of extrinsic denominatives is obviously very closely related to that found in Soncinas. Finally, Hochschild does not refer to the new critical editions of Scotus’s works, but relies on old, unreliable editions.

The book is nicely produced, with a useful index. The copious notes are placed at the end, but with running titles so that they can be easily located. The main text is refreshingly free of typographical errors (though ‘Vencenzo’ on p. 30 and in the index should read ‘Vincenzo’). However, some of the Latin passages in the notes seem not to have been proofread. A particularly bad example is note 6 on pp. 207-208 which contains five obvious errors, including two occurrences of ‘nomis’ for ‘nominis’.

To sum up, this book should certainly be read by Thomists, and by anyone who wants a readable account of what Cajetan actually said. On the other hand, it will be disappointing for those who want to set Cajetan in a wider context, whether of the development of post-medieval scholasticism or of the history of logic in the later Middle Ages. Nor does it have anything to offer those working in contemporary philosophy of language who are not ready to accept a medieval Aristotelian framework for their discussion. It will be interesting to see whether Hochschild can use this book, which grew out of his doctoral dissertation, as a basis for further exploration of the issues it raises.