The Semantics of Knowledge Attributions

Semantics Knowledge Attributions

Michael Blome-Tillmann, The Semantics of Knowledge Attributions, Oxford University Press, 2022, 256pp., $80.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198716303.

Reviewed by Dan Zeman, University of Warsaw


Michael Blome-Tillmann’s latest monograph, The Semantics of Knowledge Attributions, is a very clear, well-structured, informative, and original book about epistemic contextualism. Comprised of five parts and twelve chapters, it contains a very useful overview of the main positions in the debate, a specification of the desiderata a theory of ‘knowledge’-ascriptions should fulfil, and a presentation and defense of the author’s preferred view—Presuppositional Epistemic Contextualism. In this review, I first offer the reader a quick tour of the books’ chapters, then present Blome-Tillmann’s view in some detail and finally flag some issues that might be worth discussing in relation to the view proposed. The purpose of my comments is not to criticize the book—which is very rich in both scope and ideas—but rather an invitation to further dialogue.

The book’s first part (the most comprehensive one) is dedicated to “epistemic contextualism”—a broad approach to the semantics of ‘knowledge’-ascriptions according to which their truth-value “may vary with the context of utterance, where this variance is traceable to the occurrence of ‘know(s) p’ and concerns a distinctively epistemic factor” (5). In the opening chapter of this part, Blome-Tillmann presents the case for contextualism, based on intuitions about the truth-value of ‘knowledge’-ascriptions in various contexts (including the famous “Bank Cases”, to be expanded on below), on the fact that it offers a plausible solution to the sceptical puzzles and that it does so without violating the closure principle. Chapter 2 discusses the most well-known semantic implementations of contextualism, differentiated mainly by the type of expression they model the context-sensitivity of ‘knows p’ after: indexicals, gradable adjectives, quantifiers, three-place predicates, etc. Chapter 3 is where Blome-Tillmann formulates an important desideratum for any contextualist view—that is,

The Explanatory Constraint:

A viable contextualist theory must offer an explication or paraphrase of the character of ‘knows p’ that sheds some light on the interaction between context and content in empirical cases and with respect to sceptical puzzles. (48)

The remainder of the chapter is dedicated to presenting how various contextualist views (i.e., those proposed by David Lewis, Stewart Cohen, Keith DeRose, Ram Neta and Jonathan Ichikawa) have proposed to meet this constraint. Finally, chapters 4 and 5 lay out the most pressing linguistic (semantic blindness, non-gradability, the lack of overt restrictors and the unavailability of free shifting) and philosophical (over-generation, conceding too much to or misconstruing the sceptic, problems with knowledge norms) objections to contextualism.

Part II of the book discusses “epistemic impurism”—the view that the truth-value of ‘knowledge’-ascriptions depends not only on purely epistemic factors, but on practical ones as well (e.g., stakes; the main view of this sort discussed is “subject-sensitive invariantism” proposed, among others, by John Hawthorne and Jason Stanley). The focus of Part III is “epistemic relativism”—the view that the truth-value of the relevant sentences is relative to contexts of assessment, chiefly advocated by John MacFarlane, while that of Part IV is “strict invariantism”—the view that the truth-value of ‘knowledge’-ascriptions is invariant across contexts, and which comes in two versions: “psychological invariantism” and “pragmatic invariantism” (each of them having a moderate and a sceptical variant). In connection to each of these views, Blome-Tillmann discusses their main forms, what they get right and wrong, and how they compare to each other.

The last part of the book expounds the view Blome-Tillmann advocates for, namely:

Presuppositional Epistemic Contextualism (PEC):

x satisfies ‘knows p’ in context C only if x’s evidence eliminates all ¬p-worlds that are compatible with what is pragmatically presupposed in C. (215)

Blome-Tillmann arrives at this view after showing, by means of cleverly constructed examples, that salience, vivid salience or very vivid salience are not what drives our intuitions about ascribing ‘knowledge’ in various contexts and that a “presupposition effect” is able to do so, together with explaining a plethora of experimental results. He stresses further that PEC merely provides a necessary condition for the satisfaction of ‘knows p’ in a context and not a necessary and sufficient one. The view is thus “neither an analysis nor a reductive definition of ‘knowledge’ and is, as a consequence, compatible with a large variety of views in epistemology: PEC can rather easily be added to most substantive accounts of the nature of ‘knowledge’, including the view that ‘knowledge’ is simple and not susceptible to analysis or reductive definition.” (215). Among the things that PEC gets right is vindicating several intuitions that we have in relation to ‘knowledge’-ascriptions, such as the following:

Anti-Sceptical Intuition:

People often speak truly when they assert ‘I know p.’ (217)

Sceptical Intuition:

People sometimes speak truly when they assert ‘Nobody knows p’ in contexts in which sceptical arguments are discussed. (217)

Fogelin’s Intuition:

People often speak truly when they assert ‘I know p’ in contexts of epistemological enquiry and discussion. (218)

Additionally, Blome-Tillmann claims that PEC is

not epistemologically irrelevant in the stronger sense explicated by Sosa [. . .], its main claims can be stated without violating Williamsonian knowledge norms of conveying [. . .], and it isn’t subject to the Factivity Problem posed by Brendel and Baumann [. . . .] As a moderate contextualist view, PEC provides us with a semantics of ‘knowledge’-attributions that avoids the pitfalls of the elusiveness of ‘knowledge’.” (218)

Finally, to the question of what expression the context-sensitivity of ‘know’ and its kin is modelled after, Blome-Tillmann gives an interesting answer. The conclusion reached in chapter 4, after discussing possible models for the context-sensitivity of ‘knows p’, is that it is quite unique: for although it resembles each of the types of expressions it is compared with in certain respects, its behavior differs from them in others. In the last chapter, however, Blome-Tillmann puts forward a different view, namely:

According to PEC, [‘knows p’] is an automatic indexical, because the semantic content of ‘knows p’ at a context is partly fixed by what is pragmatically presupposed at the context, and speaker intentions do not play a direct role in fixing the content of ‘knows p’. However, let us leave aside PEC for the moment, and consider the question of whether what speakers intend to express by their use of the word ‘knows p’ at a context C can intuitively make a difference as to what ‘knows p’ expresses at C. The answer to this question is that this seems impossible, or at least extremely difficult; if we want to change the content of ‘knows p’ we have to change the context (which amounts, according to PEC, to changing what we pragmatically presuppose). In other words, ‘knows p’ receives its content at a context C independently of what content the speaker intends to express by tokening ‘knows p’ in C; the content of ‘knows p’ is, at a given context, fixed independently of the speaker’s intentions. ‘Knows p’ is accordingly a pure indexical, and as such—in Perry’s words—automatic. (221)

The main reason Blome-Tillmann takes ‘knows p’ to be an automatic (rather than an intentional) indexical like ‘I’ or ‘today’ is the unavailability of shifting mid-sentence with such expressions (as examples like ‘I am hungry, but I’m not hungry’ attest). If one thus takes ‘knows p’ to be an automatic indexical, then the unavailability of standard-shifting mid-sentence in ‘knowledge’-ascriptions is expected.

I take PEC to be at minimum an interesting and original view and quite possibly a better version of contextualism than previous ones. In what follows, I want to draw attention to a couple of issues that I think would add to the discussion and, if properly addressed, perhaps even strengthen the case for PEC. The first issue I’d like to raise in relation to Blome-Tillmann’s discussion of epistemic contextualism is the absence of certain, more complex cases of ‘knowledge’-ascriptions. At the center of his discussion are the “Bank Cases” and many similar ones, in which the same sentence is uttered in contexts that differ in one or more epistemically significant ways. But these are simple cases of ‘knowledge’-ascriptions, in that the subject ascribes or denies ‘knowledge’ to herself in those contexts; more complex ones, in which a) the subject of the ‘knowledge’-ascription is in a different context and b) that context differs from the one of utterance in epistemically significant ways have been discussed in the literature. Now, Blome-Tillmann mentions one such case (128) that is then wielded against various competitors (e.g., subject-sensitive invariantism)—what Stanley (2005: 4) has dubbed “HALSS”: a slight modification of one of the original Bank Cases involving ‘knowledge’-ascriptions in the third person made by an asserter in a high-stakes scenario about a subject in a low-stakes scenario. How exactly such cases are handled by PEC we are not told, but one can follow the following reasoning to account for the intuition that the denial of the relevant ‘knowledge’-ascription in such a scenario is true. Since, according to PEC, what is pragmatically presupposed in a context C plays a crucial role in establishing whether a subject satisfies ‘knows p’ in C, the stakes in the subject’s context are not the ones that are relevant, but those in the context of the asserter instead. Since the asserter is in a high-stakes context and assuming (with Blome-Tillmann) that stakes influence what is pragmatically presupposed in a context C, by taking what the asserter pragmatically presupposes to be the crucial factor, the HALSS case is accounted for.

However—and this is what I want to point out—there are also similarly complex cases for which an answer on behalf of PEC might not be that straightforward. For example, the reverse case to HALSS has also been discussed in the literature: “LAHSS”, also a slight modification of one of the original Bank Cases involving ‘knowledge’-ascriptions in the third person made by an asserter in a low-stakes scenario about a subject in a high-stakes scenario. Such cases have been thought to be problematic for contextualism generally (see, among others, Stanley (2005)) in that it cannot easily account for the intuition that the relevant ‘knowledge’-ascription is false, and they might be problematic for Blome-Tillmann’s version of contextualism as well. It strikes me as somewhat mysterious that the LAHSS-type of case is not discussed in the book. While such cases might not eventually be problematic for the view,[1] it would have been good to see how PEC handles them—if for no other reason than to prove the view’s capacity to account for (a wider range of) complex cases of ‘knowledge’-ascriptions, especially given that such cases have played a rather important role in the debate between contextualism, invariantism, relativism and the other views on the market.

The second issue I want to raise is of a more speculative nature, and it consists in pointing to a less-explored phenomenon in relation not to ‘knowledge’-ascriptions, but to the other expressions that are mentioned in the book—e.g., predicates of taste, gradable adjectives, etc. The phenomenon hinted at is “perspectival plurality” (Kneer (2015, 2020); Kneer, Vicente & Zeman (2017); Zeman (2019)): the availability of readings of certain sentences that require accessing two or more perspectives. Here is an example involving predicates of taste:

At this year’s Halloween, Johnny played a silly prank and ate a lot of tasty licorice.

This sentence can be interpreted as saying that the speaker finds both the prank silly and the licorice tasty, but a different, equally plausible reading, is one in which the licorice was tasty for Johnny, but the prank wasn’t silly for him (in fact, he thought the prank was awesome).[2] Such sentences are in essence combinations of egocentric uses (i.e., from one’s own perspective) of the predicates in question with exocentric uses (from someone else’s perspective); such uses have been discussed extensively in the literature on predicates of taste (see, among others, Lasersohn (2005), from whom the labels come from). This is a robust phenomenon backed up by experimental studies and which has been taken to be problematic for several views about the predicates in question.

Now, one potentially interesting issue to explore is whether this phenomenon is also present with ‘knowledge’-ascriptions. Although no experimental studies testing this have been published so far, I believe an intuitive case for such sentences exhibiting the phenomenon in question can be made. Imagine, for example, that Sally is attending to the situations of two different people—Alex and Joe, while not being involved in those situations at all. Both Alex and Joe are each in a situation similar to that in the Bank Cases, with the issue being that of the bank opening on Saturday. While Alex is in a low-stakes situation in which whether she deposits the check before Monday is of no consequence, Joe’s situation is such that a lot depends on whether the check is deposited in the bank before Monday—the stakes for him are very high. After hearing Alex uttering the sentence ‘I know the bank will be open on Saturday.’ and Joe uttering its negation (in the two separate situations), Sally seems to be able to put these together and felicitously utter

Alex knows that the bank will be open on Saturday, but Joe doesn’t.

But if so, in order to properly interpret Sally’s utterance in relation to the situations described, access to both their situations needs to be assured. Assuming that the difference in the two situations affects the standard needed to satisfy ‘know’, the sentence seems to have a plural reading in the sense mentioned above.[3]

What exactly does such a reading, if indeed available, imply for PEC? One immediate consequence is that, since the reading in question is a case in which epistemic standards are shifted mid-sentence, and since such shifting is not available in the case of automatic indexicals, Blome-Tillmann’s characterization of ‘know’ as behaving like an automatic indexical is wrong. This is not a big problem in itself, but it might have some unwanted repercussions for the general picture. First, if ‘knowledge’-ascriptions behave neither like automatic indexicals nor like intentional indexicals, gradable adjectives or quantifiers, then on what context-sensitive type of expression are they modelled after all? Since answering this question is a major desideratum that Blome-Tillmann sets out for any contextualist view, not having a precise answer to this question is a serious drawback. Second, how exactly would PEC deal with such readings? On the general contextualist picture adopted, ‘knowledge’-ascriptions come with variables for standards, and this might suggest that for each appearance of ‘know’ there is a corresponding variable in the logical form. However, this in itself doesn’t solve the issue, as all kinds of restrictions might be in place about giving values to those variables: as Lasersohn (2008) has shown in the case of predicates of taste, complete freedom leads to unwanted predictions for the contextualist;[4] the answer is thus far from trivial. More importantly, since according to Blome-Tillmann what is pragmatically presupposed in a context C plays a crucial role in establishing whether a subject satisfies ‘knows p’ in C, the question arises of what exactly has to be presupposed in a context in which the plural reading of a sentence like the one in the previous paragraph is the salient one. On the face of it, to get the plural reading, what is presupposed in that context needs to be compatible both with all the ¬p-worlds eliminated by one subject’s evidence (Alex’s) and with all the ¬p-worlds eliminated by the other subject’s evidence (Joe’s). But since one subject is in a low-stakes situation (Alex) and the other in a high-stakes situation (Joe), this seems an impossible task, so it’s not entirely clear how PEC handles such readings.[5] I concede, however, that more experimental work is called for in order to establish the robustness of this phenomenon in relation to ‘knowledge’-ascriptions. But, regardless of whether the perspectival plurality of ‘knowledge’-ascriptions presents a problem for Blome-Tillmann, it strikes me as a fruitful issue to be further explored.

Although more engagement with issues like the ones briefly presented would have expanded the book’s reach, there is no doubt that The Semantics of Knowledge Attributions is a useful tool for those who want to familiarize themselves with the vast literature on ‘knowledge’-ascriptions and with the intricate problems that arise in that area, as well as for those steeped in the epistemic debates, urging them to engage with a well-argued for and improved version of epistemic contextualism.


DeRose, K. (2004). “The Problem with Subject-Sensitive Invariantism”. Philosophy and Phenomenological Research 68: 346–350.

Kneer, M. (2020). “Predicates of personal taste, semantic incompleteness, and necessitarianism”. Linguistics and Philosophy 44 (5): 981–1011.

Kneer, M. (2015). Perspective in Language. PhD Dissertation, Institut Jean Nicod/ENS Paris.

Kneer, M. Vicente, A. & Zeman, D. (2017). “Relativism about Predicates of Personal Taste and Perspectival Plurality.” Linguistics and Philosophy 40: 37–60.

Lasersohn, P. (2008). “Quantification and perspective in relativist semantics”. Philosophical Perspectives 22, 305–337.

Lasersohn, P. (2005). “Context Dependence, Disagreement, and Predicates of Personal Taste”, Linguistics and Philosophy 28: 643–686.

Pinillos, Á. (2016). “Experiments on Contextualism and Interest Relative Invariantism”, in A Companion to Experimental Philosophy, ed. J. Sytsma and W. Buckwalter, 349–358. John Wiley & Sons, Ltd.

Stanley, J. (2005). Knowledge and Practical Interests. Oxford: Clarendon Press.

Zeman, D. (forthcoming). “Relativism and Retraction: The Case Is Not Yet Lost”, in Retraction Matters, ed. D. Zeman and M. Hîncu, Springer.

Zeman, D. (2019). “Multiple Indexing Relativism about Predicates of Taste”. Crítica. Revista Hispanoamericana de Filosofía 51(151), 5–34.

Zeman, D. (2010). “Knowledge Attributions and Relevant Epistemic Standards”, In Context-Dependence, Perspective and Relativity, ed. F. Recanati, I. Stojanovic, and N. Villanueva, 225–250. Mouton de Gruyter.

[1] For example, one way to respond would be to adopt a flexible version of contextualism, following DeRose’s early work. In reply to an objection to contextualism based precisely on the type of case described above, DeRose claims that “There’s nothing in contextualism to prevent a speaker’s context from selecting epistemic standards appropriate to the subject’s context, even when the subject being discussed is no party to the speaker’s conversations” (2004: 348). As far as I can tell, this route is open to Blome-Tillmann as well—although the details of how this exactly would be couched in terms of what is pragmatically presupposed in a context C needs to be worked out. Additionally (and crucially), what must be provided is a principled way to shift to the epistemic standards of the subject, on pain of ending up with an ad-hoc view. Incidentally, flexibility is also what helps epistemic relativism in dealing with similar cases, as well as with other problems mentioned by Blome-Tillmann in chapter 8 (e.g., retraction). For a flexible relativist view of ‘knowledge’-ascriptions, see Zeman (2010); for a general flexible relativist view and how it can help with retraction, see Zeman (forthcoming).

[2] For many more examples with predicates of taste, as well as with epistemic modals, aesthetic and moral terms, gradable adjectives, etc., see the references provided above.

[3] Blome-Tillmann mentions an example that seems to have the relevant plural reading: ‘Miya and Paul have exactly the same evidence for p, but only Miya has enough evidence to know p, Paul doesn’t.’ (136). He uses this example to argue against epistemic impurism, but doesn’t say anything about how it is handled by PEC. See also his discussion (223, footnote 11) of a sentence used by Pinillos (2016) in an experimental study that might also have the relevant plural reading.

[4] As argued in Kneer, Vicente & Zeman (2017), the phenomenon is problematic for relativism as well. Thus, if the intuitive case made above about the availability of plural readings in the case of ‘knowledge’-ascriptions is accepted, this raises a problem for epistemic relativism as well. For a solution that appeals to “multiple indexing” in application to predicates of taste that might also work for the case at hand, see Zeman (2019).

[5] They also aren’t cases in which our intuitions are “unclear and imprecise” and thus allowing an explanation in terms of indeterminate presuppositions—as those discussed by Blome-Tillmann in chapter 11 (section 11.5).