The Senses: Classic and Contemporary Philosophical Perspectives

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Fiona Macpherson (ed.), The Senses: Classic and Contemporary Philosophical Perspectives, Oxford University Press, 2011, 410pp., $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 9780195385960.

Reviewed by Peter W. Ross, California State Polytechnic University, Pomona


This collection makes it clear that philosophical issues about the sensory modalities deserve attention. It comprises eleven 'classic' works, eight previously unpublished papers, and a substantial introduction by Macpherson. All of the classic works (with the exception of a selection from Aristotle's De Anima) were published in the past 50 years. Some of these selections -- in particular, De Anima and H. P. Grice's 1962 essay "Some Remarks about the Senses" -- are classic in any context. However, the other classic selections have been underappreciated until recently, when the philosophical literature on sensory modalities started gaining more attention. Together the classic works demonstrate the challenge, complexity, and sheer (philosophical) fun of issues having to do with senses. The previously unpublished papers, most of which originated as invited papers for a 2004 conference titled "Individuating the Senses" at University of Glasgow, largely build on the classic works.

Macpherson's preface announces why it's important to think about senses. Most importantly, we need to broaden our understanding of perception. The large majority of philosophical accounts of perception have focused on vision to the exclusion of other modalities. However, generalizing from vision to other modalities is risky, and philosophy of perception might well be systematically skewed. With this point in mind, taking up the issue of how to distinguish among senses -- the primary issue considered by a majority of the selections -- enforces a broadening of our account of perception and allows us to better understand the nature of senses and the perceptual states they produce.

In her ambitious introduction, Macpherson does a great deal of setting up for the selections that follow: she claims that examination of senses is timely because of newly developing science of perception in humans and non-humans, provides some helpful background discussion for the issue of distinguishing senses, presents her own approach to distinguishing senses, and gives a brief overview of each of the selections. (A significant portion of the introduction, including a good deal of the background and all of the presentation of the alternative approach, is also contained in Macpherson's "Taxonomising the Senses," Philosophical Studies, 153, 1 (March 2011): 123-142.)

The background discussion offers important distinctions, prominently that between the questions: 'how many token senses does a creature have?' and 'what types are those senses?' The former question (which she calls the token question) is elaborated to encompass issues such as what makes a particular perceptual system instantiated in a creature different from the creature's other perceptual systems and non-perceptual systems. The latter question (which she calls the type question) includes the focal issue of how to type a particular perceptual system as being of one sensory modality rather than another. Macpherson precedes a discussion of standard approaches to the type question with descriptions of nontraditional candidates for being senses, such as proprioception (by which we gauge the motion and position of parts of our bodies). Macpherson then outlines standard approaches to typing senses and offers her alternative proposal for typing, which I'll discuss after a survey and discussion of the classic works which present the standard approaches.

The classic works, at least on the face of it, form a tightly knit suite. The selection from De Anima, interpreted and criticized by Richard Sorabji's companion essay, sets out Aristotle's distinction between common sensibles (such as shape), which are perceived by multiple senses, and proper sensibles (such as color), which are perceived by one sense. Aristotle is interested in how we distinguish senses, and his idea that a difference in sense requires a difference in proper sensible is a standard proposal considered in the classic selections.

In "Some Remarks about the Senses," Grice offers four candidate criteria by which we might draw distinctions among senses: (1) distinctive perceptible properties (such as size, shape, and color), (2) a special introspectible character of perceptual states (which is a qualitative difference that Grice holds to be separate from qualitative differences of perceptible properties), (3) a distinctive physical stimulus involved in perception (such as light or pressure waves), and (4) a characteristic sensory organ including its connection to the brain (such as eyes or ears and its connections to the brain) (p. 85). The remaining classic selections -- by J. W. Roxbee Cox, C. A. J. Coady, John Heil, Mark Leon, Norton Nelkin, M. G. F. Martin, and Brian L. Keeley -- take Grice's suggested criteria as their point of departure.

Grice's criteria are offered in the spirit of exploration of the issue of distinguishing senses, but they also provide the basis for his own variation on Aristotle's proposal, according to which the introspectible character of perceptual states, as opposed to proper sensibles (which are perceptible properties of external objects, not properties of perceptual states), is crucial: Grice proposes that the introspectible character criterion is indispensible for distinguishing senses.

According to Grice, the introspectible character criterion is indispensable if there is an imaginable case where introspectible character distinguishes senses and other criteria do not; in such a case, introspectible character cannot be dispensed with in favor of one or more of the other criteria (pp. 93-94). Grice's charming "friendly Martian" thought experiment provides the (purportedly) imaginable case where introspectible character alone distinguishes. The Martians have two sets of sensory organs, "each pair more or less like our eyes," which are sensitive to light and perceive size, shape, and color; these sensory organs are for x-ing and y-ing. According to proposed criteria (1), (3), and (4) -- the property, physical stimulus, and sensory organ criteria -- x-ing and y-ing are instances of seeing. But, Grice continues, if we ask a Martian whether x-ing blue is like y-ing blue, the Martian says "Oh, no, there's all the difference in the world!" Grice contends that x-ing and y-ing are found to be different senses due to the supposed difference in introspectible character (p. 94).

Of the authors of classic selections, only Leon sides with Grice regarding the indispensability of the introspectible character criterion. Nevertheless, Grice frames the question that all of these authors address: of the four candidate criteria for distinguishing senses, which is indispensable? 

For each criterion, there is at least one proponent who claims that it is at least indispensible for distinguishing senses. Roxbee Cox proposes a 'key feature' account, taking a proper-sensible style property criterion as the sole basis for distinguishing senses (however, he gives a somewhat unclear role to contextual factors as well, pp. 118-119). Heil proposes, rather, that the physical stimulus criterion is the sole basis. Leon claims that the introspectible character criterion is at least indispensable. Nelkin claims that the sensory organ criterion is indispensible.

Regarding the accounts that propose a single criterion as the sole basis for distinguishing senses, it's notable that Aristotle acknowledged challenges for this kind of account from the beginning. His proper-sensible account has difficulty with touch, since touch has more than one proper sensible (including, for him, temperature and dryness). Thus, even if proper sensibles are necessary conditions for individuating senses, they aren't sufficient, unless we allow that touch is subdivided into separate senses. The physical stimulus account faces the difficulty that pressure waves can be both felt and heard (Heil notes this, p. 151, and claims that such cases are borderline cases). A deeper problem is this: should a physical stimulus be considered from the standpoint of physics? If so, then all electromagnetic stimuli -- visible light, infrared radiation, X-rays, etc. -- are considered a single stimulus type. If electromagnetic stimuli identify vision, though, then a modality sensitive to X-rays is vision. But that's controversial. Even Heil (pp. 147-148) takes sensitivity to X-rays as involving a sense distinct from vision. However, it seems that he must appeal to other criteria, such as the property or sensory organ criteria, to account for this distinction. And Grice himself points to the diaphanousness of experience (what is currently called the transparency of experience) as a problem for an account that takes introspectible character as a sole criterion for distinguishing senses (pp. 93, 99).

Some writers of the classic selections opt to combine criteria for distinguishing senses. Nelkin claims that a combination of "sorts of beliefs about the external world with the correlated origins of those beliefs is best for individuating the senses" (p. 199). The relevant sorts of beliefs seem to be about perceptible properties, and the relevant origin is in a sensory organ. Thus, it seems that Nelkin offers a combination of the property criterion and the sensory organ criterion. And Keeley is quite clear (p. 227) that he proposes four necessary and sufficient criteria for distinguishing senses: the physical stimulus and sensory organ criteria (as suggested by Grice), as well as a behavior criterion (with respect to discriminating amongst physical stimuli), and an evolutionary or (individual) developmental history criterion.

However, it's not clear how multiple criteria are supposed to work. Taking Keeley's criteria, any objection to the physical stimulus criterion as being a necessary criterion applies to his proposal as well. Similarly, any problem with treating the sensory organ criterion as being necessary applies to his proposal. And so on for each criterion. So multiplying criteria just seems to multiply problems (Grice points to this issue, p. 93).

Considering that the authors of the classic selections published since "Some Remarks about the Senses" share a point of departure in Grice's criteria,[1] and are concerned with the indispensability of criteria for distinguishing senses, the effort to sort out these criteria would seem to be a shared one. Yet, the appearance of there being a shared endeavor is belied by the authors' disparateness of purpose. When the classic selections were written, the philosophical literature on senses was in a very early stage of development, and I think that some authors have been too reliant on Grice's framing, for some authors' purposes are so different from Grice's that this framing has led them astray.

In fact, it's informative to survey what very different purposes the writers of the classic selections had. Aristotle, as Sorabji explains (pp. 67-68), is not seeking necessary and sufficient conditions for distinguishing senses, but is aiming to give a descriptive taxonomy of senses for zoological purposes. Grice (noting his ignorance of zoology, p. 85) takes up the issue of the distinction among senses to get at the issue of the nature of perceptible properties. He identifies his aim as considering "perhaps not uninteresting questions concerning the independence of [his four] criteria, and in particular . . . the relation between the first [the property criterion] and the second [the introspectible character criterion]" (p. 85). While distinguishing senses provides the means, Grice's aim is to get at whether the perceptible properties of objects and introspectible character of perceptual experiences are independent. By arguing that the introspectible character criterion is indispensable, Grice raises the question of whether the introspectible character criterion is independent of the property criterion as well as necessary for distinguishing senses. However, this dual role for introspectible character faces problems, namely, the diaphanousness of experience and an unacceptable contingency in the relationship between perceptible properties and introspectible character. These problems can be avoided, though, by denying that the property and introspectible character criteria are independent. The result is that certain perceptible properties (such as colors) are necessarily related to certain special introspectible characters (such as the generic resemblance among visual experiences) (pp. 99-100).

Thus, Grice uses the issue of distinguishing senses as a way of approaching the issue of the nature of perceptible properties. Leon's purpose is largely the same (compare Leon's pp. 168-173 with Grice's pp. 99-100), and he argues that certain perceptible properties (again, such as colors) are in part constituted by introspectible character (pp. 163, 172). In addition, Grice's focus on getting at the nature of perceptible properties doesn't demand that he propose necessary and sufficient conditions for distinguishing senses, and he doesn't provide such a proposal.

Roxbee Cox and Coady offer direct attempts to undermine Grice's claim that the introspectible character criterion is indispensible. Both are primarily worried about epistemic issues regarding introspectible character, and would be similarly worried whether introspectible character is appealed to as a result of considerations about inverted spectra or about distinguishing senses. Their goal is to avoid appeals to introspectible character altogether. Martin also aims to avoid epistemological problems, but problems specifically due to ineffable mental properties of sense data. His focus is to construe introspectible character in a way that doesn't commit to sense data. Thus his concern is not to avoid introspectible character, but to render it effable. He seeks to do this in terms of the distinctive phenomenologies of space in different modalities (his focus is on contrasting the phenomenologies of space in vision and touch).

Heil, Nelkin, and Keeley each aim to provide an account of distinguishing senses which devises a concept of sense useful to the sciences. Each of these authors rejects the appeal to introspectible character in this science-oriented endeavor. However, they aren't concerned about the general epistemological problems associated with introspectible character that worry Roxbee Cox, Coady, and Martin. Rather, allowing that introspectible character exists, these authors claim that introspectible character is nevertheless beside the point with regard to distinguishing senses (Heil, p. 144; Nelkin, pp. 192-195; Keeley, p. 238). Furthermore, unlike Grice and Leon, these three authors are not interested in using the issue of distinguishing senses as a way of getting at the nature of perceptible properties. For example, Heil (p. 141) assumes that colors are physical properties of physical objects, and so assumes that they are contingently related to introspectible character. A conflict in purposes is evident here, since whether properties such as colors are contingently related to introspectible character is the very question that Grice tries to address.

Most importantly, Grice's criteria bolstered the idea that senses need necessary, or necessary and sufficient, criteria for their distinction. Consideration of necessary criteria has its place when, following Grice's purpose, we are concerned with the relation between perceptible properties and introspectible character. However, consideration of necessary, or necessary and sufficient, criteria might well be the wrong approach to take more generally. A case in point: rather than being necessary and sufficient criteria, Keeley's criteria are much more plausible as four factors involved in explaining the existence of senses (as Richard Gray's essay points out, pp. 258-259). For example, it's plausible that there is an evolutionary explanation for vision in terms of light-receptive sensory organs that enable us to discriminate among objects. Thus, Keeley's framing in terms of necessary and sufficient conditions seems an unfortunate hold over from Grice's.

By contrast, Macpherson's alternative to standard ways of typing senses sidesteps necessary and sufficient criteria, instead treating each of Grice's criteria as a dimension in a four-dimensional space. She stresses that the advantage of a modality-space style alternative is that questions such as 'Is bat echolocation audition?' aren't procrustean yes/no questions: in a modality space, echolocation is similar to, but different from, human hearing.

As promising as Macpherson's approach seems to be, there's one important gap in her presentation of it: she needs to include a justification of the dimensions. As Macpherson notes (p. 25), many philosophers claim that the dimension for introspectible character should be dispensed with in favor of the dimension for perceptible properties. So, is the introspectible character dimension indispensible? We're back to the question: Are Martian x-ing and y-ing human vision?

Of the eight previously unpublished essays, those by Heil, Robert Hopkins, and John O'Dea straightforwardly build on classic works. Heil further defends his physical stimulus account. Hopkins builds on Martin's characterizations of the distinctive phenomenologies of vision and touch. O'Dea claims that a combination of the property criterion and a version of the sensory organ criterion are necessary and sufficient for distinguishing senses. According to O'Dea's sensory organ criterion, we gauge the distinctive exploratory actions of the sensory organ parts of the body -- thus, it is in this respect a proprioceptive account.

Tim Bayne's contribution likens agentive experience to proprioception itself. Bayne states "I take agentive experience to have as its core the experience of a particular movement or mental event as realizing one's own agency" (p. 357). Understanding the term 'agentive experience' to be neutral on the issue of whether such experiences are belief-like, desire-like, or perceptions, Bayne takes up this issue and claims that this variety of self monitoring involves perceptions. In particular, Bayne suggests that (a) proprioception is a sense in that it involves a dedicated mechanism for processing information about the world (in this case, the body). Then Bayne proposes that (b) agentive experience is relevantly similar to proprioception. Although both (a) and (b) face objections, these are interesting claims to consider.

A. D. Smith examines Grice's explanation for why we don't attribute pains to objects that cause pain (a point Grice takes up at the beginning of "Some Remarks about the Senses"). Smith offers trenchant criticism of Grice's explanation, and offers his own.

Austen Clark's contribution focuses on an empirical finding: a cue perceived in one modality can enhance uptake of a target in another. For example, a visual cue perceived to an experimental subject's right can increase the processing speed and accuracy of an auditory target subsequently presented to the subject's right (relative to the processing speed and accuracy of an auditory target subsequently presented to the subject's left) (pp. 376-377). Clark's empirical question: how does such cross-modal cuing work? Clark argues that the answer to this question involves multi-modal representation of the same external locations.

Richard Gray and Matthew Nudds explore a whole new dimension of investigation, namely realism about senses. The authors of the classic selections don't explicitly address the issue of realism. Nevertheless, despite their variety of aims, rejecting realism isn't on the table; realism is a default position. However, Nudds rejects realism, arguing that senses are better thought of as convenient fictions by which we communicate to each other information about how perceiving takes place (e.g., referring to taste communicates that perceiving takes place by contact). In their two contributions, Gray adjudicates the dispute between realism and anti-realism, while Nudds tries to further support anti-realism. In this discussion, realism about senses is taken to hold that senses are psychological kinds. Thus, Nudds contends that senses aren't psychological kinds. His contribution aims to nail down this point.

To this end, Nudds claims that a psychological kind involves a single process. Furthermore, taking the example of vision, he claims: "Evidence that vision is instantiated by a single process is evidence that there is a single, functionally significant process whose operation enables us to see" (pp. 328-329). He then contends that evidence that vision involves functionally distinct ventral and dorsal pathways demonstrates that vision is not a single process. However, what constitutes a "functionally significant process" isn't clear enough, at least in Nudds's presentation, to carry the weight of denying that senses are real. Nudds relies on Robert Cummins's concept of functional analysis. But Cummins, who claims that analyses go all the way down to the physical level, doesn't suggest that there is a level of psychological kinds where a process can be thought of as a naturally singular psychological process.

In addition, as Gray states, Cummins's concept of functional analysis isn't the only relevant concept of function; functional significance has an evolutionary aspect, a point Nudds doesn't consider. In weighing reasons for and against realism, Gray highlights problems for realist accounts that distinguish senses in terms of necessary and sufficient criteria. Yet, he concludes that a version of realism which treats Keeley's necessary and sufficient criteria as explanatory factors for senses' existence is better supported than Nudds's anti-realism. (In this context, Gray classifies my view[2] as one offering necessary and sufficient criteria. But I don't offer sufficient criteria, and I'm skeptical that satisfactory necessary and sufficient criteria can be formulated. Instead, I offer a single necessary criterion, the property criterion, with the aim of dispensing with the introspectible character criterion.)

The Senses leaves us with many questions to address. Can an account of distinguishing senses in terms of necessary and sufficient conditions work? If not, what alternative options do we have for characterizing senses? If we take Macpherson's modality space alternative, how do we determine the appropriate dimensions? Taking a step back to consider realism: according to what characterization of senses do we determine whether realism is true? How far can this characterization depart from a common-sense characterization? And, following up on an aspect of Macpherson's token question which doesn't get much attention in this volume: what is it for a capacity to be perceptual? (Presumably, if a capacity isn't perceptual, it can't be classified as a sense.) Can a capacity that produces no qualitative states be perceptual? The Senses is a terrific book, for all sorts of reasons. It conveys these questions (among many others) and so gets us to focus on important issues in philosophy of perception. It provides countless interesting examples of scientific findings relevant to the philosophical issues (one perhaps unexpected example: Leon, p. 162, remarks that a Gricean imaginary case is similar to the McGurk effect). It makes prominent a rich, largely unexplored literature. And it serves as a solid foundation on which future research will undoubtedly flourish.[3]

[1] Sorabji's 1971 examination of De Anima is an exception.

[2] "Common sense about qualities and senses," Philosophical Studies, 138 (April 2008): 299-316.

[3] Thanks go to Brian Keeley for helpful comments on a draft of this review.