The Sensitivity Principle in Epistemology

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Kelly Becker and Tim Black (eds.), The Sensitivity Principle in Epistemology, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 294pp., $99.00 (hbk), ISBN 9781107004238.

Reviewed by Marc Alspector-Kelly, Western Michigan University


The simplest version of the sensitivity principle imposes a modal constraint on true belief: if the proposition believed were false, one would not believe it. Its advocates incorporate that constraint -- or more typically another constraint which resembles it -- into their views on knowledge in a wide variety of ways. Although versions of the principle were originally introduced by both Robert Nozick (1981) and Fred Dretske (1970), this volume concentrates on Nozick's version and associated doctrines. Most of the thirteen essays are critical; only four (by Peter Murphy and Tim Black, Lars Bo Gundersen, Kelly Becker and Sherrilyn Roush) mount defenses.[1]

The essays range widely over the terrain associated with sensitivity. They discuss closure, belief-forming method, the value of knowledge, testimony, adherence, dispositions, skepticism, evidentialism, necessary truths, induction, epistemic luck, easy knowledge and bootstrapping, and safety.[2] As a result, the reader is treated to cutting-edge discussion of a variety of contemporary epistemological issues by leading figures thematically centered on, but by no means limited to, sensitivity. I will follow the closure theme below in way of illustration, but anyone interested in the other themes will be rewarded by reading the volume.

Closure is the thesis that if S knows P and competently infers Q from P, thereby coming to believe Q, then S knows Q.[3] Sensitivity implies that closure sometimes fails. My belief that I have hands is sensitive: in the nearest world in which I don't have hands (due to an unfortunate experience with a table-saw, say), I am acutely aware of their absence. "I have hands" implies "I am not a handless brain in a vat" (h-BIV). But the latter is insensitive: if I were an h-BIV, I would continue to believe (as I do) that I'm not an h-BIV.

Closure denial is a very unpopular move; for many it is the decisive objection to sensitivity. As the h-BIV example illustrates, however, it has its advantages: the sensitivity theorist can respect the intuition upon which the skeptic pounces -- that we don't know we're not h-BIVs -- without renouncing ordinary knowledge. There are, however, a host of examples of closure failure that embarrass even those willing to deny it.

The most famous is Saul Kripke's "red barn" case.[4] The countryside is sprinkled with barn façades -- fake barns planted to please the tourists -- but the façades are painted blue. Henry sees what looks like, and is, a red barn, believes that it's a red barn, and infers that it's a barn. If it weren't a red barn, it wouldn't look like one -- if it were a façade, it would be blue -- but if it weren't a barn, it might be a façade and so look like a barn. So, closure fails. But it's very hard to swallow the claim that I could know that it's a red barn but not know that it's a barn.

Relativization to method might be thought to avoid this.[5] While Henry would believe that it is a barn if it weren't, he wouldn't believe so by the method "inferring it from 'it's a red barn'". So, if what sensitivity requires is that one would not believe P by the same method were P false (although one might still believe it), then Henry knows both that it's a red barn and that it's a barn, and closure is preserved.

As Becker points out in "Methods and How to Individuate Them" (devoted to the formulation of an account of method individuation against embarrassing closure failures), appeal to method works well in similar cases wherein both propositions are intuitively known.[6] He concedes, however, that in Red Barn intuition is on the side of denying, rather than affirming, knowledge of both propositions. He tentatively proposes that knowledge of a conjunction requires sensitivity to each conjunct; since "it's a red barn" amounts to "it's red" and "it's a barn", and Henry isn't sensitive to the latter, he doesn't know the conjunction (even though he is method-relative sensitive to it).

In "Nozick's Defense of Closure", Baumann suggests that, far from denying closure, Nozick endorsed a closure principle ("Nozick-closure") according to which knowledge is acquired by inference when belief in the premise is sensitive to the truth of the conclusion.[7] Henry's belief in "it's a red barn" is sensitive to the truth of "it's a barn" (if it weren't a barn he wouldn't believe that it's a red barn), so this satisfies Nozick-closure, despite the insensitivity of "it's a barn".

But this resolves closure in the same less appealing direction as does the appeal to method: instead of knowing neither proposition, Henry knows both. In fact, these responses come to the same: it is precisely because he wouldn't believe the premise if the conclusion weren't true that he would not employ the same method (inferring from "it's a red barn") that he actually employs in arriving at the conclusion. It is also a bit odd to call Nozick-closure a closure principle; it still allows that I can know that I have hands, for example, without knowing that I am not an h-BIV (if I were an h-BIV I'd still believe that I have hands).[8] If one's reason for endorsing closure is to avoid "abominable conjunctions" like "I know that I have hands but I don't know that I'm not a handless BIV", then Nozick-closure doesn't count.[9]

Both Nozick-closure and appeal to method are susceptible to other embarrassing closure failures, such as Jonathan Vogel's "New Shoes" Case.[10] Omar informs you that his shoes are new, so you know "Omar has new shoes", from which you infer "I do not falsely believe that Omar has new shoes". If you know the premise, Vogel claims, you know the conclusion. But the conclusion is insensitive since, if it were false -- if you did falsely believe that Omar has new shoes -- you would still believe the premise, and infer the conclusion from it. The conclusion is, moreover, method-insensitive and (therefore) Nozick-closed.

In "Sensitivity Meets Explanation", Murphy and Black respond to this and related cases by proposing that S knows Q only if either Q is sensitive or, when Q is competently inferred from a known P, Q's being false doesn't explain why S falsely believes P.[11] Although "I falsely believe that Omar has new shoes" implies thatI believe Omar has new shoes, it doesn't explain why I would believe that. "I do not falsely believe that Omar has new shoes" therefore satisfies the second disjunct, and so S knows it notwithstanding its insensitivity.

They also apply "explanationist counterfactualism" (EC) to the red barn case. Henry's looking at a barn façade would, they claim, explain why he would incorrectly believe that there is a red barn, since it would explain why he mistakenly believes there is a barn before him. So "it's a barn" is both insensitive and fails their explanationist condition; it therefore is not known. They then suggest, like Becker, that knowledge of a conjunction requires knowledge of each conjunct; since "it's a barn" is a conjunct of "it's a red barn", and I don't know the former, I don't know the latter, despite the latter's sensitivity. (This does not contradict EC, which is offered only as a necessary condition on knowledge.)

But there are problems. First, in Kripke's case all the fake barns look blue; so while its being a fake would explain Henry's believing that it is a barn, it wouldn't explain his believing that it is red. So it is at least unclear that EC fails. Second, while the fake barn scenario might do (some) explaining, the falsity of the conclusion does not. The conclusion is merely "it's a barn", the falsity of which is "it's not a barn". While being a façade is one way to not be a barn, it's not the only way; its not being a barn on its own does not explain why Henry believes it is (let alone why he believes it's red).

Compare a case in which EC arguably gets the right answer: John Hawthorne's "Misprint".[12] I read that the Broncos won in the (reputable) newspaper. I then infer that the paper didn't erroneously report that they won as a result of a printing error. The latter is insensitive. Also, its being false would explain why I believe the Broncos won. So by EC I don't know it, which is intuitively correct.

However, the premise is sensitive. So (unless there's another necessary but unmet condition of knowledge), I know it by EC. So, closure fails. Perhaps that's OK, since intuition agrees: surely I can know that the Broncos won by reading a reputable newspaper. But the case does indicate that there is at least no guarantee that EC will preserve closure.[13]

Murphy and Black's EC, along with the constraint on knowledge of conjunctions, renders sensitivity a sufficient but unnecessary part of a necessary condition of knowledge. Perhaps there is a way to massage relativization to method, constraints on knowledge of conjunctions (and, perhaps, disjunctions), explanationism, or something else, embed them within some such framework along with sensitivity, and avoid the embarrassing cases of closure failure. One might worry, however, that sensitivity itself will be buried too deeply within the account for its undeniably intuitive force to be felt.

Safety theorists hope for a more surface-level resolution: endorse a different but related modal principle that implies closure on its own. Safety is the contrapositive of sensitivity -- were one to believe P, P would be true -- and so attractive to those generally disposed to a modal account. There is, correspondingly, a section of this book devoted to comparison of the two (all of the essays in the section claim victory for safety). There is not room here to address these comparisons. It is, however, at least unclear that safety really does preserve closure.[14]

In a previous work, Roush simply imposed a recursive closure clause on sensitivity: one knows if either one's belief is sensitive or one infers it from what one knows.[15] She also recast sensitivity in probabilistic and fallibilistic terms: sensitivity to p requires that the probability that one does not believe p given that p is false be greater than s, where s (the "sensitivity threshold") is high.

In "Sensitivity and Closure", however, she revises the recursion clause: one knows if either one's belief is sensitive or one infers it from what one tracks (and so which is sensitive). The revision is designed to resolve an error growth problem. The requisite probability threshold for knowledge of the premise(s) may be less than 1, as may be the threshold for the basing relation (requiring that one's belief in the conclusion be based on one's belief in the premise).[16] As a result, repeated applications of the recursion clause -- multi-step inferences -- can drop the sensitivity level of the conclusion lower and lower, so that one eventually counts as knowing propositions whose sensitivity level drops below .5.[17]

The new recursion clause still allows for insensitive knowledge by inference: whatever the value of the sensitivity threshold s, the clause permits a conclusion to be known despite its sensitivity level's having dropped below s. The revision, however, limits how far it can fall, at least in single-premise cases.[18]

Of course, someone sympathetic to a representation of sensitivity in probabilistic and fallibilistic terms will be disturbed if his account permits beliefs with low sensitivity levels to be known. But if Roush is willing to allow that beliefs with sensitivity level s-n (for some not-too-big n) nevertheless count as known, why not simply set s-n itself as the sensitivity threshold, so that any belief meeting it, however acquired, counts as known? It is possible, after all, for multi-step inferences that don't satisfy the new recursion clause to generate conclusions whose sensitivity is above s-n: the penultimate conclusion's sensitivity, whose premises are sensitive, falls just below s, but remains high enough to confer sensitivity above s-n on the ultimate conclusion. If a one-step inference with a conclusion whose sensitivity is above s-n counts as known, why not a two-step inference with a conclusion whose sensitivity is also above s-n (notwithstanding the penultimate conclusion's falling below s)?

Roush responds to the proposal that we could just set the sensitivity level to s-n and call it a day by claiming that her view permits the enunciation of a closure principle, thereby helping us to determine when knowledge by inference is possible. Closure as characterized earlier now fails on her view. But this version survives: if S is sensitive to p, knows that p implies q, and believes q on that basis, then S knows q.

This won't satisfy those determined to avoid abominable conjunctions, since it allows one to know p, know that p implies q, believe q on that basis, and yet still not know q (see the example two paragraphs above.) But again, perhaps that's not such a bad thing. As Roush, Baumann, and Becker emphasize, there are also embarrassing cases of closure-success, such as Misprint.[19] (It's not just hard to be a sensitivity theorist, it's hard to be an epistemologist.) On the other hand, it is not clear that Roush's view doesn't remain susceptible to some of those cases too; Misprint, for example, appears to satisfy both old and new recursion clauses.[20]

Nonetheless, the detailed and sophisticated articulation and development of Roush's views, and those of the other authors in this volume that are sympathetic to the sensitivity principle, is an indication that the resources available to them are far from exhausted. Overall, this volume is well worth the read for both friends and foes of sensitivity.


Alspector-Kelly, Marc (2011). "Why Safety Does Not Save Closure", Synthese 138:2, 127-42.

Cross, Troy (2010). "Skeptical Success", in Tamar Gendler and John Hawthorne, eds., Oxford Studies in Epistemology, vol. 111 (Oxford University Press), 35-62.

DeRose, Keith (1995). "Solving the Skeptical Problem", Philosophical Review 104:1, 1-52.

Dretske, Fred (1970). "Epistemic Operators", Journal of Philosophy 67:24, 1007-23.

Goldman, Alvin (1976). "Discrimination and Perceptual Knowledge", Journal of Philosophy 73:20, 771-791.

Hawthorne, John (2004). Knowledge and Lotteries (Oxford University Press).

Kripke, Saul (2011). Philosophical Troubles: Collected Papers, Volume 1 (Oxford University Press).

Nozick, Robert (1981). Philosophical Explanations (Harvard University Press).

Roush, Sherrilyn (2005), Tracking Truth: Knowledge, Evidence, and Science (Oxford University Press).

______ (2010), "Closure on Skepticism", Journal of Philosophy, 107:5, 243-56.

Vogel, Jonathan (2000). "Reliabilism Leveled", Journal of Philosophy 97:11, 602-23.

[1] Although they both appear in the part called "Defenses, Applications, Explications", Peter Baumann's essay "Nozick's Defense of Closure" really sides with a closure principle against sensitivity, and Sanford Goldberg's essay "Sensitivity from Others" identifies a tension between sensitivity and what Goldberg considers to be the only defensible treatment of knowledge from testimony.

[2] Adherence is Nozick's other modal condition on knowledge: were P true, S would believe P. Sensitivity -- "variation", in Nozick's terminology -- and adherence together constitute "tracking". Safety is described below.

One notably absent theme is Keith DeRose's influential incorporation of sensitivity into a contextualist account of knowledge attributions.

[3] I'm sidestepping a number of issues concerning closure's formulation.

[4] This is now (finally) in print, in Kripke 2011, ch. 7.

[5] Nozick himself introduced such relativization, albeit for different purposes.

[6] Alvin Goldman's "Dachshund" case is an example (Goldman 1976). You see and believe that the animal in front of you is a dachshund and infer that it's a dog. If it weren't a dachshund you wouldn't believe it was. But if it weren't a dog a wolf would be there instead, which you would mistake for an Alsatian, and so still believe that it's a dog. However, you wouldn't believe it by the method "infer that it is a dog from 'it's a dachshund'".

[7] I've omitted a corresponding adherence clause here.

[8] As Baumann notes, in Nozick (1981) Nozick-closure appears as a transmission principle, specifying when one can acquire knowledge in virtue of performing an inference from what one knows. Transmission and closure are distinct: the latter doesn't require that knowledge of the conclusion derive from performance of the inference; it only requires that one ends up knowing it.

[9] The abominable conjunction was introduced in DeRose (1995).

[10] Vogel introduced this example in Vogel (2000). In his contribution to the present volume, "The Enduring Trouble with Tracking", he provides a useful systematic treatment of this and other examples he had previously introduced.

[11] The idea originates with DeRose (1995). Also see Troy Cross (2010).

[12] See Hawthorne (2004).

[13] It's unclear whether this is Murphy and Black's intention, although their comments on 28-29 seem to suggest that it is.

[14] In this volume, Jonathan Kvanvig denies it and Duncan Pritchard affirms it. So does Roush, despite her opposition to safety. I side with Kvanvig; see Alspector-Kelly (2011).

[15] Roush (2005). Roush is one of the few contemporary sensitivity theorists who also endorse the adherence component of Nozickian tracking. I've deleted her revision of the adherence condition here for simplicity's sake. Stephen Luper's contribution to the present volume, "False Negatives", provides a persuasive argument against any adherence condition.

[16] According to Roush, the belief in q is based on the belief in p only if P(-b(q)/-b(p)) is high, where p is the premise and q the conclusion. (For consistency I've switched her p's and q's.)

[17] Interestingly, the thresholds representing my knowledge of the inference itself drop out of the calculation. This is at least odd. Although Roush's fully formulated recursion clause (254-5) requires knowledge of the inference, that knowledge plays no role in the determination of the level of sensitivity of the conclusion. It is then hard to see in what sense knowledge of the conclusion depends on it (except by definitional fiat).

[18] It's not clear how the revision will address the problem in the multi-premise case.

[19] The bootstrapping and "easy" or "cheap" knowledge cases are also candidates, discussed by Baumann, Becker, Brueckner, and Roush. Misprint itself is not discussed by any authors in this volume.

[20] Brueckner points this out with respect to similar examples, to which Roush responds by denying that the inference really goes through in the cases he cites. (See also Roush (2010).) But it's hard to deny that "the Broncos won" implies "the paper did not erroneously report that they won as a result of a misprint".