The Severity of God: Religion and Philosophy Reconceived

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Paul K. Moser, The Severity of God: Religion and Philosophy Reconceived, Cambridge University Press, 2013, 218pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9781107615328.

Reviewed by Scott A. Davison, Morehead State University


I know what severe storms are, and severe headaches, and severe turbulence. I even know some severe parents. But what would it mean to say that human life is severe, or to say that God is severe?

In this book, Paul Moser hopes to "illuminate not only the nature of life's severity but also its value and its purposes, if it actually has value and purposes" (p. 3). He makes it clear that there is a difference between questions about severity and questions about evil: not all severity in human life is evil, although some of it is. Moser seems to count things that are "rigorously difficult" as severe (see p. 2), but he really seems to have in mind especially things that are unavoidable and unwanted -- for instance, it is rigorously difficult to win a competitive triathlon in one's spare time, for fun, but we might not count this as a severe fact about the triathlete's life. As Moser states it, the problem of divine severity is "the problem of whether -- and if so, why -- a God worthy of worship would allow human life to be as severe or rigorously difficult as it actually is, at least at times" (p. 4).

In chapter 1, Moser explains what would make a God worthy of worship and how such a being might use severity in life to pursue a personal, cooperative, redemptive relationship with human beings. Moser introduces 'God' as "a supreme title of personal perfection, rather than a proper name" (p. 11) (although he tends to use 'God' later as a proper name, and to assume a number of things about God in the process; more on this below). He argues that to be a God, one must be worthy of worship, which includes inherent moral perfection that seeks the good of everyone, including enemies (pp. 12-13). Aristotle's god would not count as a God (p. 14), for instance, nor would an omnipotent but morally imperfect being (p. 13). In fact, nothing Moser says here suggests that there could not be more than one God. He adds that if a God existed, then this God's purpose would be to "give morally impeccable life to others noncoercively and lastingly, in their companionship, reverence, and worship of God" (p. 14).

But why is moral perfection required in order for a God to be worthy of worship? And why would a God be so interested in giving others morally impeccable lives, as opposed to pursuing some other goal? Moser does not offer detailed arguments for these claims, or consider alternative positions in any detail, and this happens with some regularity in the book. (To his credit, sometimes he points the reader to other places in which he has discussed similar issues in print.) Many philosophers, especially those in the analytic tradition who are accustomed to detailed, point-by-point arguments for crucial claims, will find this aspect of Moser's book disappointing (except for the discussion of evidential atheism on pp.190-205).

Moser argues that if a God had the purpose described above, then such a being would bring "serious conflict" into the lives of human beings for the sake of their redemption (p. 16). In order to explain the relationship between wisdom and righteousness or justification, he embarks on a detailed exegetical discussion of St. Paul's letters (pp. 23-9). This is the first of many systematic-theological sections of the book, in which the evidence adduced for a position includes appeals to various Biblical commentators, to observations about Greek grammar, and to chapter and verse references in the Christian scriptures. (I estimate that nearly half of the book consists of these systematic-theological discussions.) Although I have opinions about some of these theological arguments, I do not feel qualified to comment on their success or failure because I am a philosopher by training, not a theologian. I predict that whereas some readers would find Moser's approach to theological questions familiar and helpful, others might find his approach to be rather uncritical in its use of the scriptural material and unacceptably ahistorical.

In the gospel accounts, in the garden at Gethsemane, during the night before his arrest and crucifixion, Jesus is depicted as asking God to "remove this cup [of suffering and death] from me; yet, not what I want, but what you want" (p. 30). Moser looks to this event in order to shed light on God's general approach to the redemption of humanity:

The heart of God's wisdom is eager conformity to God's perfect will, come what may. Such conformity is exemplified in Jesus Christ, in his Gethsemane attitude of humble obedience to God. This attitude led to his death on a Roman cross, but God, according to Paul, was working in his obedient death to manifest the power of God's self-giving love for wayward humans and eventually to overcome that death. (p. 31)

As a result, if a God exists and Jesus's attitude here reveals that God's approach to us, then we would face "a divine challenge to undergo a volitional makeover" that "calls for our gladly receiving our need of and dependence on God's life giving power" (p.32). If we do not respond freely and favorably to this challenge, "God may hide divine wisdom and power from us," in fact, "our not being volitionally present to God may prompt God to refrain from being present in our evidence" (p. 32). Moser does not consider the justice of such a God's decision to become hidden to those who do not respond to the challenge, let alone the role of luck in human decisions, considerations that could complicate this picture considerably.[1]

A severe God, Moser argues, would not necessarily oppose all unrighteousness immediately (p. 37), especially if such opposition would not be the most efficient or productive approach to the redemption of all. (It follows from this that such a God must have a great deal of knowledge concerning the future, or at least knowledge of the probable future, although Moser does not discuss this question.) For example, a God might permit some free creatures to perform evil actions, such as crucifying Jesus, without directly causing such actions (p. 41). Here Moser appeals to a distinction between God's permissive and executive will, but does not mention any philosophical or theological discussions of the nature of freedom, responsibility, providence, or evil. As indicated earlier, some readers will find these broad brushstrokes disappointing.

Still in chapter 1, Moser suggests that in the deliverances of conscience, we might acquire direct, de re knowledge of God as a person:

The most plausible human context for direct acquaintance with God is human conscience. This is the psychological place where a human could directly know, and be known, together with God (see the etymology of "con + scientia") as God calls a person (sometimes, to account) in the second person, as you. (p. 45, italics in original)

He says that "The role of human conscience in knowledge of God is widely neglected among contemporary philosophers" (p. 45), but he does not talk about why this might be so. There are lots of interesting epistemological issues right beneath the surface here, issues that occupy many of the contemporary philosophers whom Moser chides, but he does not discuss them here or in chapter 3 (see below).

In chapter 2, Moser explores the problem of flux (impermanence, constant change) as a threat to human flourishing. He rejects arguments from Bernard Williams and Thomas Nagel concerning the meaninglessness of eternal life and recommends the possibility of the divine infusion of agape love as a "stabilizer" to guarantee human flourishing forever. He also claims that a God would use the flux to remove obstacles to union with God, so that there is a kind of "meaning-conferring explanation" of at least some of the flux in the world (p. 72).

Chapter 3 is devoted to the idea that the evidence of God's existence and love is not public and uniformly accessible to everyone, but rather revealed differently to different persons, based on their willingness to engage in "divine corrective reciprocity" (p. 89). "With divine corrective inquiry in human experience, the Source of humanly experienced agape can self-reveal (to receptive humans) to be beyond merely human or natural processes, thus indicating the mistake of human self-credit for divine agape" (p.104, italics in original). Moser argues that miracles and natural theology could never produce the kind of knowledge of a God that would be important for human beings to possess (and that we should not find a God's hiddenness surprising), but that a God could provide direct, de re knowledge to those who responded appropriately to God's initiative: "God's love being poured into our hearts is no mere belief; it is a salient experiencethat serves as the cognitive, evidential foundation of well-founded belief in God" (pp. 119-20, italics in original).

Chapter 4 is entitled "Severity and Salvation," and is about St. Paul's conception of salvation, especially the role of human agency, faith, and works. Chapter 5 is entitled "Severity and Philosophy," and develops a conception of Christian philosophy, especially with reference to the writings of St. Paul. According to this conception, "Christian philosophy cannot be merelyacademic or impersonal, because it cannot abstract from questions and facts about our deepest motives and our personal standing before God in Christ" (pp.184-5, italics in original).

A test question arises for any proposed Christian philosophy: does the philosophy uphold the importance of one's obediently dying with Christ under the guiding agent-power of God as "Abba, Father"? If not, then the philosophy misses the mark as a distinctively Christian philosophy. (p. 82)

The second to last section of chapter 5 is a detailed discussion of "evidential atheism," the view that we should not believe that God exists because of the direction of our overall available evidence (pp. 190-205). I suspect that readers of this review who have no substantial interests in Christian theology would find this section to be the most interesting one; it is carefully argued and connects straightforwardly to other debates in the philosophy of religion.

By way of summary, Moser provides a provocative account of why a God might have good reasons for permitting severity in human life. This account certainly appears to satisfy Moser's own description of a Christian philosophy, and some readers will find this aspect of the book to be very important. But without detailed formulations of the problem of divine severity, the purported solution, and alternative approaches (namely, the kinds of detailed formulations to which we have become accustomed in philosophical discussions of the problem of evil), it's hard to say whether or not Moser actually solves the problem of divine severity as described at the beginning of the book.

My brief summary cannot do justice to Moser's detailed discussions, but I hope it provides an overview of the terrain that he covers, and the way in which he covers it, that will be helpful to prospective readers.

[1] Compare this to St. Augustine's remarks on God's justification for allowing children to suffer: "Since God achieves some good by correcting adults through the suffering and death of children who are dear to them, why shouldn't those things take place? . . . And as for the adults for whose sake [the children] suffered, either they will be better, having learned from temporal adversities to choose an upright life, or they will have no excuse to avert their punishment in the judgment to come, since they refused to let the anguish of this life turn their desire toward eternal life" (On Free Choice of the Will, translated with an introduction by Thomas Williams (Indianapolis: Hackett Publishing Company, 1993), pp.116-7). See also Linda Zagzebski, "Religious Luck," Faith and Philosophy volume 11, number 3 (July 1994), pp. 397-413.