This book is, and delights with, a fireworks display of erudition. Michael Rosen weaves together lessons from (1) Frederick the Great’s poetry (written in French); to (2) an important but forgotten debate between Diderot and Falconet; to (3) Maria von Herbert’s letter to Kant (and how this was taken up, first flippantly by Walter Benjamin and then, more seriously by Rae Langton)—to name just three examples. He helps readers get orientated within contemporary debates in Hegel scholarship, and intervenes in a number of interpretative and philosophical debates. There is poetry and rigorous argument construction. There is sensitivity to the finer subtleties of the German language (a pertinent example is 122–3) and clarity of English prose.
Readers might find themselves dazzled by these fireworks. Indeed, the sense of being dazzled might also arise as they are faced with what is, in effect, not one, but (at least) two books. Relatively late into the proceedings, we are told that Rosen’s book has two objectives: (a) ‘to revise received views of Kant and Hegel’ and (b) ‘to illuminate the broader process of secularization’ (234)—a process which, as we will see below, Rosen argues remains importantly incomplete. There is meant to be a connection between the two objectives: the revised interpretations of Kant and Hegel are meant to be used to further the second objective. Yet, sometimes it feels like the first objective takes on a dynamic of its own. Chapter 5 is a case in point: it contains a critical discussion of (Rawlsian) Kantian ethics which seeks to interpret Kant’s categorical imperative as a formal decision-making procedure, against which Rosen deploys Hegelian and other resources to conclude that Kant’s ethics is better understood as a substantive moral philosophy orientated around respect for personhood. While interesting in its own right, it is unclear how this proposed revision contributes to illuminating the broader process of secularisation (or its incompleteness). Additionally, if the aim really was to use Kant interpretation to illuminate this process (rather than to settle some debates about Kant interpretation that are independent of that), there are some clear missed opportunities. Notably, while Rosen makes a strong case that we cannot understand Kant’s (and the German Idealists’) notion of autonomy without understanding it on the model of God’s inner necessity (11–12; and Chapter 4), it is surprising that he does not make more of the fact that transcendental freedom (and thereby negative freedom) is also modelled on God, this time the idea of God’s absolute spontaneity. (Perhaps it is Rosen’s wish and, in Chapter 3, attempt to defend Kant’s notion of (transcendental) freedom that gets in his own way here).
In what follows, I will focus on the second of the two objectives—Rosen’s attempt to illuminate the broader process of secularization. In part, this is because any review of any book, but of this book in particular, will not be able to discuss all aspects or lines of argument. I choose this focus because the publisher has made the second objective into the one that it presents to potential readers as the real topic of the book. Indeed, it is that objective that—as we will see shortly—explains its title. Most importantly, however, I focus on that objective because it strikes me that it is here where the most important contribution of the book lies—and its potential for having the greatest impact. As much as readers might enjoy Rosen’s attempt to revise received views of Kant and Hegel, the debates surrounding these views are already well-trodden and entrenched.
To unlock the riddle that drives Rosen’s book with respect to the second objective, it is helpful to read Rosen as asking the following question:
What is the position to which Adorno’s claim about how Auschwitz invalidates theodicy is the objection?
Let me explain. In an interview, Rosen states the following about his book:
The book is written forwards but it could have been written backwards from my puzzlement at Adorno’s very strange claim about Auschwitz: that Auschwitz was the modern equivalent of the Lisbon Earthquake. (2022)
This is very revealing and helpful, not least in making sense of the fact that the work is bookended by a discussion of Theodor Adorno and Auschwitz (20, 303–7; see also the Afterword, 311–4). Why is it that Rosen is puzzled about Adorno’s ‘very strange claim’? One might think that with the Lisbon Earthquake the defensibility of any theodicy was dead and buried, but this would be to think of theodicy as mainly raising questions about how the natural world could be constituted to create such suffering, if it were the work of an all-powerful, benevolent God. However, Rosen is not so much interested in the various theological responses that seek to uphold the idea of theodicy in the face of natural catastrophes. Instead, he notices the shift in target in Adorno’s 20th century critique of theodicy compared to Voltaire’s 18th century one, and that this shift is not just about moving from a natural to a human-made catastrophe. Instead, Rosen proposes that the target is something more complex and specific: the idea of historical immortality, a ‘conception of history as collective self-realization’ (20).
This central concept of the book requires explication. Rosen wants to argue that the modern process of secularisation has remained importantly incomplete—that we are, in crucial ways, still standing in the shadow of God (specifically the Judeo-Christian idea of God). Hence, the book’s title. One key plank of the Judeo-Christian religious worldview was the idea of personal immortality: that each person’s soul was immortal, and that we could be rewarded and punished for our deeds on earth in the eternal afterlife. Rosen’s Nietzschean thesis is that, even though many of us moderns have eschewed belief in personal immortality, we are still in the grip of a substitute, devoid of much of the religious substance, but still ultimately theological in nature. This substitute is what Rosen calls ‘historical immortality’. While many of us might expect and accept that what will become of us, as individual persons, is simply dust, we have transferred the idea of immortality to a collective unit, in which we as individuals can be said to live on and to whose eternal flourishing we can contribute—indeed, if we are in the grip of this idea, we will think that we have a duty to contribute to this (something which might be of contemporary importance in the context of the climate emergency that our actions and inactions are bringing about for future generations).
Rosen names this idea after a title of a lecture by Herder, with one important modification. For Herder—and other early adaptors like (implicitly) Kant—the idea is about human immortality (158) and thus universality. And this is echoed in early Fichte (160–4). But already within Fichte’s own lifetime and in his own (later) work, the idea proves amenable to being attached to particularistic collective units, notably the (German) nation, that fall short of humanity. We are moving here even more to imagined communities than already was the case in the universalistic rendering, but this—as history has painfully taught us—need not mean that such imagination can’t have real effects on how people run (and ruin) their lives and those of others.
Rosen concentrates mainly on the rich vein that is Kant and German Idealism in tracking the development of the idea of historical immortality. He traces a kind of morphing sequence that begins with Kant, in whose work personal and historical immortality still exist side-by-side with each other, and the secularisation process only concerns the depersonalisation of (Christian) religion, whereas, as mentioned before, key notions (like autonomy) are theologically shaped. In Hegel, the secularisation process goes further, in that personal immortality is (according to Rosen) dropped. While religiosity gets progressively hollowed out—and indeed cannot survive in the rationalist framing (245)—there remains a theological legacy in the successor idea of historical immortality. Also, with Hegel, following Fichte, the collective unit to which immortality attaches is more contextual and historical than in Kant (which, among other things, means—Rosen insists (183–6, 188)—that war is an essential element in Hegel’s overall theory).
However, Rosen does not restrict himself to Kant and German Idealism but finds the idea of historical immortality—in the important Chapter 9—also in British (Burke and Mill) and French figures. (It is here that the debate between Diderot and Falconet comes in, with Diderot’s subscribing clearly to the idea of historical immortality: for him, it would be an utter catastrophe and life-paralysing, to know that humanity would become extinct in a 1,000 years). Indeed, in various allusions to Marx and to actual history, Rosen suggests that the hold of this idea was not confined to the academy or public intellectuals but had everyday and wider social significance. Notably, it needs to be reckoned with in explaining both fascism (taking up a particularistic version of the idea) and socialism (taking up a universalist version). In a sense, historical immortality—this seems to be the implicit thought in Rosen’s book—might simply be at its most thorough and explicit in Kant and the German Idealists; and this is, I suspect, why he focuses so much on these authors (and on revising currently received views about them, since these views block us from seeing this).
One might have hoped for more detailed evidence of the general claims. But in what follows I want to accept for this review’s sake that Rosen is correct in his Nietzschean thesis that, even though many of us moderns have eschewed belief in personal immortality, we tend to be still in the grip of a substitute, the idea of historical immortality.
Instead of questioning this thesis, I want to pursue the question of what is to be done, if this were, indeed, correct. To make progress with that question, it is helpful to direct our attention briefly back to the idea of personal immortality. In part with the help of Frederick the Great, Rosen brings out how powerful a grip this idea must have had on people (289). Yes, the idea of personal immortality might allow one to think of eternal salvation and bliss, but it also implied the distinct and decidedly uncomfortable possibility of eternal torment. If people were fundamentally attached to this idea despite this risk, then this attests to how powerful an idea they must have found it in coming to terms with the world. Now, although Rosen does not say this explicitly, he seems to think that the substitute for personal immortality—historical immortality—holds us supposedly secular moderns in a similarly powerful grip. So, it is not obvious whether we could simply free ourselves from it, even if we saw (perhaps thanks to Rosen’s disclosive work) that it had a hold on us and wanted to rid ourselves of it.
Interestingly, Rosen is somewhat ambivalent in the book about how far he wants to go with his Nietzschean narrative: does he want us to step out of the shadow of God and work, as hard as we can, to rid ourselves of the powerful idea of historical immortality? Or does he want ‘just’ to tame the idea and hold on to it? (It is clear from what he does say that the idea needs to be tamed, at the very least, since—as seen—he thinks it can be used for nationalist and other problematic purposes, and was so used, starting from the later Fichte.)
In the already mentioned recent interview, Rosen adds to the ambivalence by stating: ‘I am with Diderot. I think knowledge of the extinction of humanity in a thousand years’ time would be an utter catastrophe and would destroy my sense of the world and my place in it’. Perhaps, this is meant just as a descriptive claim about how even Rosen, as a Nietzschean critic, finds himself in the grip of the idea of historical immortality, and about how powerful this idea really is—so powerful that our sense of the world and our place in it is inextricably tied up with it. This would, at the very least, suggest that taming the idea is the best we can do. But maybe what Rosen says here is actually evidence that he thinks that there would be real loss if we gave up on it.
My suggestion, in what follows, is that we should be more Nietzschean and try to wean ourselves off the idea of historical immortality. There is a longer story behind this. Still, the fundamental reason is the one Rosen mentions, Adorno’s invocation of ‘the metaphysical significance of Auschwitz’ (20) against any idea of theodicy, most notably the modern secularised one of historical immortality.
I do want to acknowledge, however, how powerful, how entrenched the idea is, and to suggest that in order to wean ourselves off it, we need to jettison more than just that idea. Specifically, we might need to change our (idea of) moral psychology—just like Elizabeth Anscombe called for in her ‘Modern Moral Philosophy’, where she describes how a shadow of God extended over the moral theorising of her time.
My suggestion is that there is a key double assumption in the background of many who stand in the shadow of God in affirming—however implicitly—the idea of historical immortality: (a) the assumption that we cannot criticise human progress without being at the same time committed to historical progress; and (b) the related assumption that we must hope for better times when we engage in (what we consider to be) moral behaviour or social critique. We prominently find these assumptions in Kant; and we find them in contemporary thinkers, especially those influenced by him (e.g., see Forst 2017). Consider how Kant, in 1793, responded to Mendelssohn’s denial that the human race has ever made (and will ever make) moral progress with a thesis about motivation: ‘hope for better times’, he wrote, is required to do ‘something that is profitable for the general well-being’. Indeed, Kant thought that Mendelssohn, in publishing his tract criticizing the idea of progress, ‘must have counted’ on that very hope (ibid.; my emphasis).
Dislodging this requires more detailed engagement than I am able to offer here. The core thought is one influenced by Bernard Williams, namely, that once our character is sufficiently formed, we no longer need a sense of hope for better times in order to engage in ethical or even moral acts. Instead, these acts are (what we might call) ‘merely expressive actions’—expressive, that is, of our practical identities, our deepest held values and beliefs; and merely expressive insofar as they do not require hope for better times, but instead are done irrespective of such hope or even without it. Once our value commitments and practical identities are formed, we can exercise these identities irrespective of hope; they function as practical necessities of a sort.
One key example of such merely expressive acts—suggesting a different moral psychology, and one that is less in the shadow of God and the idea of historical immortality—comes from the life of Jean Améry. He experienced torture at the hands of the Gestapo and SS, something which ‘blocks the view into a world in which the principle of hope rules’ (Améry (1980), 40). Yet, Améry acted defiantly, notably literally hitting back against one of his tormentors in the Buna-Monowitz labour camp to assert his dignity. It was as much a deliberate act as any core cases we consider to be deliberate acts. For example, it involved forethought: Améry realized that acting in this way would make his own survival (even) less likely, but summoned the courage to do it anyway. Also, he grappled with the difficulty of what it would take to exert his own dignity. (Interestingly, we find in Améry a similar view of dignity to the one that Rosen has eloquently presented in his earlier 2012 work.) Améry recognized that ‘the merely individual, subjective claim (“I am a human being and as such I have my dignity, no matter what you may do or say!”) is an empty academic game, or madness’ (1980, 89). He concluded that instead he had to manifest his claim, to objectify it in the world. This was not to change his tormentor’s view—he had given up on that kind of possibility long before, when tortured. More generally, Améry did not take himself to be achieving the outcome of changing the future, however unlikely. Rather, the purpose of the act lay in the act itself and, thereby, in the objectification of the dignity, giving reality to its status as not just a subjective claim, but a categorical value.
In a parallel way, the writings of Mendelssohn or Adorno might be understood as criticising the idea of progress without committing the authors to intending to contribute to the progress of humanity as a whole. Such critiques are expressive of certain commitments (such as respect for victims, notably those tormented and killed in the pursuit of historical immortality). These critiques are intelligible irrespective of hope for progress, and of ascribing such hope to its authors.
Once we take this perspective—the perspective that it is intelligible that we can have certain values and identities that we express irrespective of hope for better times—it might become easier to rid ourselves of the idea of historical immortality, and perhaps even easier to keep a sense of the world and our place in it. Instead of despairing, like Diderot, if we came to know that human history would come to an end, we might, like Goethe, plant an apple-tree in the face of all that—and do so simply as an act expressive of our existing commitments. Or perhaps we might plant a billion apple trees or fight against injustice. As Rosen puts it towards the end of his recent interview: ‘if we make our commitments into just that, commitments—then maybe we’re OK.’ Maybe, I would add, we can even step out of the shadow of God (or at least out of the particular shadow to do with historical immortality).
In all this—and much more—we will be helped by this fascinating book. It reads as if one is in one of Rosen’s seminars. As anyone can testify who has had the privilege to be taught by him, this means being treated to a richness of form and content. There is something to learn on every page, often exactly by what might seem, at first, like a digression.
Jean Améry, At the Mind’s Limits. Bloomington & Indianapolis: Indiana University Press, 1980.
Rainer Forst, ‘The Concept of Progress’, in his Normativity and Power. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 2017, Chapter 4.
Fabian Freyenhagen, ‘Acting Irrespective of Hope’, Kantian Review 25(4) (Dec. 2020): 605–630.
Mary J. Gregor (ed.) (1996). Immanuel Kant—Practical Philosophy, trans. by Mary J. Gregor. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1996.
Michael Rosen, ‘Philosophising under the shadow of God’, Interview by Richard Marshall , 3:16 [website]. Available at: https://www.3-16am.co.uk/articles/philosophising-under-the-shadow-of-God. Last accessed 13/07/2022 at 3.16pm.
Michael Rosen, Dignity: Its History and Meaning. Cambridge, MA: Harvard University Press, 2012.
 Kant, ‘On the Common Saying: That May Be Correct in Theory, but It Is of No Use in Practice’, in McGregor (ed.) (1996), 8:273–313/277–309, here 8:309/306. The first is a reference to the volume and page numbers of the Royal Prussian Academy edition (Kants Gesammelte Schriften); the second to McGregor’s translation.
 For more detail, see Freyenhagen (2020)