The Signature of the World: What is Deleuze and Guattari's Philosophy?

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Eric Alliez, The Signature of the World: What is Deleuze and Guattari's Philosophy?, trans. Eliot Ross Albert and Alberto Toscano, with a preface by Alberto Toscano, Continuum, 2005, 240 pp, $29.95 (pbk), ISBN 0826456219.

Reviewed by John Protevi, Louisiana State University


The work is the English translation of Alliez's 1993 work, La Signature du Monde (Paris: Cerf), and two appendices, separately published short works of Alliez on Deleuze. Alliez is one of the leading French philosophers who take Deleuze seriously, and this translation makes available to Anglophone readers a fascinating and important, though dense and difficult, work of commentary on the last collaboration of Deleuze and Guattari, their 1991 What is Philosophy?.

Now this is a difficult book to review, not just for its conceptual and stylistic difficulty, but also because to review this work is to betray it, in a rigorous way. For a review is a sort of representation of a work, a repetition without much of a difference, an overview that provides the reader with information on the basis of which he or she can perform a cost-benefit analysis as to the time investment needed to actually read the book. The problem here, of course, is that Deleuze and Guattari, and Alliez, would consider such a representative review as one mode of writing, one practice in the political economy of the academy, which the philosophy of Deleuze and Guattari wishes to avoid -- or better, not simply to avoid, but to show its inferiority, its complicity with non-thought, with "communication" and "opinion." (An additional difficulty is that any review would be hard-pressed to merely approach, let alone equal or surpass, the quality of Alberto Toscano's Preface.)

In other words, I risk the classic performative contradiction in all writing "on" critiques of representation: I'll have to try to represent in this review the critique of representation offered by Alliez. "Offered" not in the sense of his representing the thesis of the critique of representation, but performed, as he undertakes his "commentary effect" in response to the "veritable ascesis" (1) imposed upon him by Deleuze and Guattari. For Alliez represents himself as undertaking an "intervention" by "multiplying marginalia" (1). Of course Alliez is himself aware of the trouble of representing his own attempts at escaping representation: how does one talk about a "pedagogy of immanence" that demands that one "follow" rather than "reproduce" (2)?

Enough of these recursivities. Let's acknowledge our betrayal, our investment in what we could call the "pedagogy of the review", and follow Alliez following Deleuze and Guattari.

A brief recap of the first part of What is Philosophy? may be useful at this point. In answering their title question, Deleuze and Guattari seek to place philosophy in relation to science and art, all three being modes of thought, with no subordination among them. Thought, in all its modes, struggles with chaos against opinion. (Readers of Deleuze's Difference and Repetition will recognize here the relation of "chaos" to the "virtual" and "opinion" to "representation.") Philosophy is the creation or construction of concepts; a concept is an intensive multiplicity, inscribed on a plane of immanence, and peopled by "conceptual personae" which operate the conceptual machinery. A conceptual persona is not a subject, for thinking is not subjective, but takes place in the relationship of territory and earth. It is in his treatment of this "geophilosophy" that Alliez prepares for his most interesting work, which occurs in the third chapter, on "onto-ethology."

In commenting on "geophilosophy" in his first chapter, entitled "The Ethics of Philosophy," Alliez focuses upon Spinoza rather than on what Deleuze and Guattari say about the Greeks. In the Spinozist moment we find a dynamic materialism in which thought's relation to the deterritorializing forces of the early capitalist market allows us to form what Deleuze and Guattari call a "principle of contingent reason." There can be no Hegelian / Heideggerian narratives here, no development or degeneration in the history of philosophy. Rather, in the Spinoza-event we find that the key to reading the "planes" of philosophy is the diagnosis of the affects of which the thinker is capable: a "material ontology" (23) of the concept or an "onto-ethology" (25). An affect is that which a body is capable of, and so the affectivity of conceptual personae becomes materially grounded in what Alliez will later not hesitate to call a "biology of intellectual action" (83). But of course this grounding is not substantial, but is the immersion in a region of forces. And the condition of creativity of concepts is the ability to find the threshold, the "critical point," where "the stifled forces of the present appeal to 'a new earth, a new people,'" in a becoming-political of philosophy (29). At this point we find the importance of the multiple senses of the French word expérience: both experience and experimentation, as the translation correctly notes. And from this word will come the confrontation with science and art that occupies the next part of Deleuze and Guattari's work and the next two chapters of Alliez.

In Alliez's second chapter, "The Aetiology of Science," he stages Deleuze and Guattari's polemic against analytic philosophy, as scientization of philosophy. Now we have to read the analytics not as Hegelians, that is, as philosophers judging science from above, but as faithful to Deleuze and Guattari's notion that philosophy, science, and art are three different modes of thought. For Alliez, Deleuze and Guattari are engaged in the attempt "to sketch a programme of physical ontology up to the task of superseding the opposition between 'physicalism' and 'phenomenology' by integrating the physico-mathematical phenomenology of scientific thought into a superior materialism founded on a general dynamics" (36). Here of course we see the refreshing courage of Deleuze and Guattari -- and that of Alliez -- in ignoring all qualms about the "end of metaphysics." Hence not only is there a need to draw a distance between Deleuze and Guattari's ontology and that of Badiou -- as when Alliez correctly notes that contemporary philosophy finds itself staging "the idea of a maximal ontological tension between Deleuze and Badiou" (34n) -- and the need to note the affinity of Deleuze and Guattari's endeavor with the great speculative metaphysics of Whitehead -- which will occupy Alliez throughout his third chapter -- but also an unacknowledged confrontation with the Derridean / Levinasian "post-phenomenologists." Although there is a sustained polemic with phenomenology throughout Alliez's work, Derrida's name is absent. And so much the better, for when it's a question of ontology, deconstructive worries can at best be propadeutic and can play precious little role in a positive construction.

Be that as it may, Alliez will note the rapprochement of epistemology and ontology attendant upon Deleuze and Guattari's position when he writes: "the act of knowing tends to coincide with that act that generates the real" (36). This act is that of "slowing down": chaos moves with "infinite speed" in the arising and dissolution of proto-forms, while science follows actualization in following the congealing of one of those forms. While philosophy "engages" the infinite speed of chaos to produce a "consistency" of thought, science "relinquishes" the infinite in forming a "function" (36). These are well known themes to readers of What is Philosophy?, but we shouldn't fail to note that Alliez is writing the French original of his text back in 1993, hence he is working without the benefit of a tradition of scholarship on the work.

In the bulk of his second chapter, Alliez rehearses five "theses" of Deleuze and Guattari on science (36-41), details their "lapidary critique" of Bergson (42-43), and discusses briefly the distinction between the two times of Chronos and Aion (44-46), before concluding with a discussion of the relation between the unitary notion of "science" in What is Philosophy? and the celebrated duality of "Royal science" and "minor science" in A Thousand Plateaus (46-51). For Alliez, there is no such distinction applicable to What is Philosophy?; in fact there is an "interaction" of the two (47) -- as is the case in A Thousand Plateaus, as Alliez correctly notes (48), for with all such dualisms, there is both de jure distinction and de facto mixture.

All this work on science in the second chapter is done with verve and insight, but the best philosophical work in Alliez's book is done in the third chapter, "Onto-Ethologics," which comments on the shortest part of What is Philosophy?, the conclusion, "From Chaos to the Brain." Here Whitehead steps to the fore, as the question is the "undoing the dependence of the point of view on a preformed subject" (53). To reinforce the importance of this point Alliez cites Deleuze from his book on Leibniz, The Fold: "a subject will be what comes to the point of view, or rather what inhabits the point of view" (54), and attempts an "approximate translation" of Albert the Great: "an agent intellect in the state of 'acquisition' by the material intellect" (55). In other words, what we see here is the construction of a "transcendental physical subject" (67), which entails the overcoming of any division between material and intellectual: the biggest, oldest, and most profound of philosophical questions.

Deleuze and Guattari's term here for the creative milieu of the material subject is "brain," so that while the major reference of this chapter is to Whitehead, there are no less interesting references to Varela, Simondon, Ruyer, and Fichte. With these references the field is opened for thinking the relation of Deleuze and Guattari to all those researches going on under the rubric "cognitive science": not simply -- but these as well -- Artificial Intelligence / Artificial Life and philosophy of mind, but also all the work of the neurosciences, "affective" as well as "cognitive." As Alliez's work is from 1993, he is not able to reference LeDoux, Damasio, Panksepp and others in "affective neuroscience," nor the attempts at a theory of A Universe of Consciousness, to cite the title of Edelman and Tononi's 2000 book. The connections an informed reader can make to these later works serve as a tribute to Alliez's prescience in posing these questions.

With the Whiteheadean "ontological auto-constitution of a new subject on the basis of its objects" (56) connected to Varela's work on self-organization in neural assemblages and the development of the concept of "enaction," or the co-arising of subject and world (59-60), we see that the brain is "that whereby a certain mode of self-affection and self-conditioning of being exists: autopoietic nucleus or fold" (62). So, philosophy, as thought which creates concepts, the object of thought, is the "ontogenesis of thought qua individuating becoming of being." We thus find in philosophy "the brain becoming subject at the moment when it poses the concept as its first object." (66-67).

Here we reach Alliez's most original concept, onto-ethology, the coincidence of being / becoming and experience / experimentation. Onto-ethology is "the establishment of a plane of immanence such that, becoming and multiplicity being one and the same, becoming no longer has a subject distinct from itself and carries thinking along with it as the heterogenesis of nature: a plane of nature" (76-77). Here is speculative philosophy at its highest point, and it can only be a tribute to Alliez that at this point his commentary performs that which it enunciates, auto-constitution or auto-affection, as we see before us a creation of the concept of the concept, the "auto-objective act that conditions the reality of every intensive multiplicity … the concept as a real being, a fold of the brain folding in on itself, micro-brain" (82). With Alliez, we touch the creation of the new, the very point of contact of matter and thought in the call for "an ethology of thought capable of following the uncharted furrows that every new creation (of concepts, functions or sensations) traces in the brain" (80). Speculative philosophy and neuroscience must be thought together (and this in his technical sense of thought as creative material auto-affection), Alliez notes: "we are faced here with something like a material image that the biology of the brain discovers with its own means and which is not without bearing on the onto-ethological nature of the concept" (80-81).

The call is clearly then that of a "biology of intellectual action" (83) capable of thinking thought as action. (Alliez's reference to Fichte at this point then makes perfect sense.) With this "conceptual vitalism," we are to write "the natural history of the concept," aiming to "restore to the concept its evental power [puissance d'événement], a power that must befall the thought that creates it in order to act directly upon the brain" (84). In this coincidence of thought, action, and material creation we have "displaced the limit between the concrete and the abstract, the sensible and the intelligible" (84) and we have thus, with Alliez's pedagogy, cut across the most important questions of philosophy in following this bold and courageous work.

Let me conclude by reminding readers of this review of my own selective focus. In describing Alliez's work on bringing speculative philosophy together with neuroscience, I have neglected his work on aesthetics and the concomitant polemic with phenomenology. This would be an essential element in any full appreciation of both What is Philosophy? and Alliez's work, which bring us to think precisely the tri-partite relation of philosophy, science, and art. Indeed, for other readers, this may very well be the most important part of the book, as it connects directly with Alliez's recent work on the aesthetics of modern painting. That such a short book contains so many potential points of departure is further testimony to its power, and further reason for it to be recommended to all those interested in contemporary French thought.