The Site of the Social: A Philosophical Account of the Constitution of Social Life and Change

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Schatzki, Theodore, The Site of the Social: A Philosophical Account of the Constitution of Social Life and Change, Penn State University Press, 2002, 296pp, $45.00 (hbk), ISBN 0271021446.

Reviewed by Joanna Crosby, Morgan State University


Through the analysis of two disparate communities, a 19th-century Shaker village and 20th-century day traders, Theodore Schatzki defends, clarifies, and revises the arguments he presented in Social Practices. These two examples provide him with a rich field of events and interactions that he uses to illustrate his concept of site ontology. The example of the Shaker village illustrates the full range of his theoretical claims. The practice of day trading concentrates Schatzki’s claims about social sites, providing a concrete and concise example of how social sites, social orders, practices, and agency provide a coherent and adequate account of social life.

While Schatzki’s explanation of the book’s title is rather obscure, the use of ‘site’ to connote a much broader set of phenomena is intriguing. The most charitable reading of his understanding of ‘site’ is as a broad, metaphoric reference to the many kinds of spaces humans inhabit: spatial, temporal, and teleological. While ‘space’ or ‘place’ would seem sufficient to serve this same purpose, and ‘space’ would also contribute alliterative value to the title, neither ‘space’ nor ‘place’ draw on the prevalence of the internet and the ubiquity of ‘sites’ found there. It is difficult for most of us to even find a ‘there’ on the internet, which may be what Schatzki is alluding to.

He gives three accounts of site. The first addresses the obvious: a site is a location where something is or takes place. This includes its location in space, in a localized context, in the history of a particular practice and also of teleological location. ‘Site’ is where something can be found, and this can include language, the span of a life, or the set of activities that make up a practice.

The second sense of ‘site’ encompasses a wider scene than the first sense. Schatzki says:

In this second sense of ‘where,’ physical space is the site where phenomena occupy physical spatial locations, and physical, activity, or activity-place spaces are the spatial sites where activity occurs (64).

To be honest, I’m not sure of the difference between the two. The first seems to be an activity’s location, the second the location of the activity. The first seems capable of encompassing both more specific as well as wider arenas of ‘site.’

Activities and locations are contextualized in the third sense of ‘site.’ To quote Schatzki once again:

Something’s site in this sense is that phenomenon or realm (if any) as part of which it is or occurs. This sense of ‘where’ shares with the second the intuition of wider scene, and it shares with the first and second senses the idea that where something is is the place it is found. Site-ment in this third sense is also a central feature of that type of context I call ‘site’: a context is a site when at least some of the entities that occur in it are inherently components of it (64-65).

It does seem a bit odd that Schatzki would see the need to create a new word when he has at his disposal ‘situate’ and ‘situation,’ both of which share the same Latin root (situs) with ‘site.’ Both ‘situate’ and ‘situation’ connote placement within a context, a key aspect of his third sense. And, if I understand correctly what Schatzki means by this, a situation could be defined as a context with inherently occurring components.

Schatzki draws on the role of human beings in articulating the distinctive quality of a social site. He says that a social site “is a specific context of human coexistence: the place where, and as part of which, social life inherently occurs (xi).” The site of the social is significant in its plasticity. Schatzki’s conception of social sites is able to account for change, intentional or not, that he posits as endemic to the social existence of human beings. Social life is composed of practice and order complexes constituent of and constituted by human coexistence. The social site is a nexus where human practices take place, where human coexistence transpires. This is where human lives ‘hang together.’

Orders and practices, claims Schatzki, comprise social sites. Together, the two form a complex mesh of human coexistence and the source of social life. “Orders,” he says, “are arrangements of entities (e.g., people, artifacts, things), whereas practices are organized activities (xi).” He examines three current theories of order within social affairs: regularity and pattern, stability, and interdependence. The first is lacking because it excludes irregularity as a form of order, ignoring irregular patterns (Wittgenstein) and the diversity of objects and concepts (Foucault). The second cannot account for instability, which Schatzki argues is a ubiquitous aspect of social life. Interdependence places unsound limits on the range of relations possible among entities within social life (17).

Rather, Schatzki proposes that we conceive of social order as “arrangements of the entities that enter social life (xxi).” These arrangements can be irregular or regular, stable or instable, and can encompass any possible relation among entities. Schatzki explains:

An adequate conception of order must encompass non-regularity in addition to regularity. Dispersion and variety are parts of social order that historically have been overlooked. Irregularity is as much a part of social phenomena as is regularity, and an adequate theoretical account of the social should be able to account for it (12).

Regularity, stability, and interdependence do reflect three categories of social order; they simply do not exhaust all the possible orders. A more inclusive notion of order comes about through looking at what they eliminate from consideration prior to examining social phenomena (24). Schatzki’s theory of the social site is able to account for the phenomena of movement, rearrangement, and reorganization that he believes are inherent in social life, but that current theory ignores.

Actions, intentions, projects, and ends are both tied to and altered in response to the contingent flow of events that results from the intertwining and conjunction of human doings with material ones. Actions, intentions, and ends are never, therefore, stable (109).

The book covers four issues of ontological significance: Schatzki’s own account of social orders and practices, agency, the characteristics of social change, and the relation between the social site and nature. His argument about agency is compelling relative to the debate over modern and postmodern accounts of subjectivity. He is not alone in his fight to preserve agency. As Ladelle McWhorter argues in Bodies and Pleasures, de-centering the subject and questioning subjectivity does not “preclude the development of causally efficacious subjects within the interplay of networks of power” (McWhorter, 77). She notes that Michel Foucault’s account of subjectivity as a self-conscious bond to identity is what makes agency possible rather than prohibiting either its existence or its exercise.

While the many challenges philosophy and social theory have issued to agency remain controversial, they do imply that one can no longer assume that ‘intentional human action’ is an adequate definition of agency (190). Using examples from the Shaker village, such as rats clogging drains with garbage, coal piled too close to a heat source catching fire, and kettles springing leaks, Schatzki shows how objects in the world can cause the activity of people, and characterizes these events as illustrative of nonhuman agency. According to Schatzki, agency needs to be defined no more specifically than as a doing. He explains, “To say that Y is attributable to the agency of X is to say that X either did Y or did something that determined Y (191).” ‘Doings’ he defines as a kind of event, one that accomplishes something within a larger chain of events. The perpetrators of doings, then, do not have to be human.

Schatzki takes this in a more controversial direction when he concludes his analysis of the accounts of fractured agency as developed by the teams of Deleuze & Guattari and Latour & Callon. Agents are not ontological entities, but rather “arrangements to which action is ascribed,” and “a unity-effect generated by these networks (207)” of organs, systems and understandings. Fracturing agency, constituting human beings as “compositional and embedding arrangements”, however, does not threaten agency itself (207). The point is not that either humans are agents or nothing is, but that human action is only such within a context of orders and practices. Human entities come to be within this context, as do what they interact with and through. Agency situates the continual and evolving occurrence of practices and orders (189).

Schatzki makes an interesting transition from the concept of human agency, which I take to mean that humans can act as agents and that through action they contribute to the existence and richness of the social site, to the concept of agential humanism, the goal of which he states is “the goal of creating a better – more human, just, and hospitable – world (192).” The implication for agency is that it can no longer be attributed solely to the intentional acts of human beings. Schatzki concludes,

A cautious humanism alone is viable today. This is a humanism cognizant, among other things, that nonhumans are agents, that humans are multiplicities whose agency rises therefrom, and that humans may not be the sole creatures in the cosmos capable of self-conscious, intentional, deliberate, planning activity (pg. 210).

This is not to say that objects are capable of such activity, but that at least with respect to agency, our anthropocentric days are numbered.

This has further implications for the development of identity. For Schatzki, identity is relational to location within a context. He says, “Meaning and identity arise (in part) from where an entity fits into the mazes of relations that characterize the arrangements of which it is a part (pg. 53).” The emergence of identity, though, remains interdependent with the site: “Someone’s identity derives partly from his or her position in arrangements and, in turn, is partly responsible for his or her position there (pg. 54).” A site becomes what it is according to the parts and entities that constitute it, and those entities and parts obtain identity through their situation.

Social orders evolve into nexuses of social practices. Practices for Schatzki are organized bundles of human activities linked through a collection of practical understandings, rules, and teleoaffectivities.

Practical understanding involve three abilities: “knowing how to X, knowing how to identify X-ings, and knowing how to prompt as well as respond to X-ings (78).” Practical understandings allow him to explain particular actions where Bourdieu’s concept of habitus or Giddens’s practical consciousness fail (79). Rules are those principles, instructions, and formulations that people adhere to or take into account when they do or say. Schatzki defines teleoaffective structures as, “a range of normativized and hierarchically ordered ends, projects, and tasks, to varying degrees allied with normativized emotions and even moods (80).”

While meaning shares in this pragmatic turn of definition, Schatzki ties it back to his concept of practices. He says: “Meaning is … a reality laid down in the regimes of activity and intelligibility called ‘practices’ (pg. 58).” A practice cannot be reduced to one single act according to Schatzki. All aspects of a practice take place within a nexus of overlapping and hierarchized nexus of social fields. He ties social orders to meaning and practice by arguing that social orders are established within practices. According to Schatzki, practices are bundled activities hierarchically organized into nexuses comprised of doings, sayings, tasks and projects that make up social phenomena. We can see this by taking a practice at random; say that of having witnesses swear on the Bible that they will give truthful testimony before they take the stand. Various activities comprise this practice, including positioning of bodies, words spoken, and oaths taken. The witness, the bailiff, the judge, and attorneys all operate within a very specific and ritualized hierarchy. The witness exists as such within a web of contexts and relations with the other entities in the courtroom, who also gain identity through acting within the situation. While the action itself seems very simple, it is only meaningful within the contexts provided by the situation as constituted through orders and practices.

Practices, however, are not ontologically distinct from orders. Orders and practices are co-contextual; Schatzki says, “Just a practices form a contexture in which arrangements exist, orders compose a contexture in which practices transpire (117).” The distinction is analytic, allowing penetration into the complexity of the mesh of social life (106).

Through careful critical analysis of the various theories that comprise social theory today, Schatzki illustrates their shortcomings and provides what he argues is a more adequate account of social life. His use of Foucault in particular is reflected in the open-ended, continually transforming social site where everything that exists within the site gains identity and significance from the site, as well as contributing to the identity and significance of everything else that exists there and to the mode of interaction or co-existence among what exists there.