The Skeptics

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Luper, Steven (ed.), The Skeptics, Ashgate, 2003, 400pp, $89.95 (hbk), ISBN 0754614212

Reviewed by Ward E. Jones, Rhodes University, South Africa


Although its title may suggest otherwise, none of the essays in The Skeptics are on ancient scepticism. Indeed, none of the pieces are historical per se. Each of the seventeen papers collected here engages directly with global epistemological sceptical arguments or challenges.

1. The Collection as a Whole

All but two of the essays are new. The reprinting of Hilary Putnam’s ’Brains in a Vat’ [1981] and David Lewis’s ’Elusive Knowledge’ [1996] was apparently motivated by concerns internal to the collection: two of the original papers are replies that closely follow the reprinted articles. Anthony Brueckner offers a dense discussion of Putnam’s paper and Robert Fogelin gives us a reply to the Lewis piece. Both are useful.

Of the remaining thirteen pieces, most of them are by people who have written extensively on knowledge, epistemic justification, or scepticism itself. This is not, of course, a bad thing, but papers by the usual suspects tend either to be restatements of previous work, or minor moves—replies or slight modifications—within their positions. Papers of the former type are less useful to the researcher, while those of the latter type less useful to the student. While more than half of the papers in this collection are one of these two types, some of the usual suspects have given us some fine papers. The contributions by Fred Dretske and Keith Lehrer, for example, recount (in a novel way) their respective positions and represent decades of important work in epistemology.

The most impressive feature of the collection as a whole is the range of positions represented. Coherentism (Lehrer), foundationalism (Gilbert Harman, Peter Klein), contextualism (Lewis, Dretske), truth-tracking (Ernest Sosa, Steven Luper), Wittgensteinian responses (in a nice discussion by Marie McGinn), Kantian responses (A.C. Grayling), and externalism—both semantic (Putnam) and epistemological (James van Cleve, Dretske)—are each major focuses of papers. In addition, we find one defeatist, Richard Foley, arguing that there are certain sceptical conclusions which we can and should accept. In the final paper in the collection, something of an odd man out, David Bloor defends the social study of science from the charges of scepticism and relativism.

Contextualism, perhaps the dominant position in current discussions of scepticism, receives healthy attack by three writers (McGinn, Sosa, and Luper). Although foundationalism gets a fair amount of attention, it is addressed in two fairly wacky papers. Harman defends what he calls ’general foundationalism’, arguing that all beliefs are justified simply in virtue of their being held; Klein, who calls his position ’infinitism’, holds that a belief can only be properly justified by ’an infinite set of non-repeating reasons’ (p. 86). These two papers remind us that the challenge of scepticism is perceived by some to require desperate measures.

Not all writers in this collection, fortunately, share this perception. Indeed, The Skeptics illustrates, perhaps more vividly than any other book on the market, just how remarkably widespread the responses to scepticism still are. At one end of the spectrum, we have those—like Harman and van Cleve—who are so convinced that scepticism is wrong that they defend their respective epistemological positions by showing that they avoid scepticism. A few pages later, however, we get Lewis defending a scepticism-friendly contextualism and Foley defending scepticism itself.

The two papers that I have so far neglected to mention are the most interesting of the new pieces in the collection. Each of them, in different ways, traverses a route unexplored in recent discussions of scepticism. In the remainder of this review I will take each of them in turn.

2. Nichols, Stich, and Weinberg: Scepticism and the Value of Knowledge

Sceptical arguments claim that our intuitions show (i) that such-and-such is a requirement for knowledge or justified belief, but (ii) that such-and-such cannot be had in some area or other of inquiry; therefore, the sceptic concludes, no one can have knowledge or justified belief in that area of inquiry. In their contribution to this volume, ’Meta-skepticism: Meditations in Ethno-epistemology’, Shaun Nichols, Stephen Stich, and Jonathan M. Weinberg argue that the sceptic’s argument would be undermined if it were to turn out that not everyone has the same intuitions in the face of sceptical scenarios. They then cite evidence that intuitions do indeed differ, and conclude that either the universal support or the universal scope of the sceptical challenge falls away.

The authors have themselves collected a range of empirical evidence that suggests that epistemic responses to imaginary situations vary among people with differing socio-economic, cultural, or educational backgrounds. A person who (i) is from a non-Western culture, (ii) has a low socio-economic status, or (iii) has had little or no philosophy, has less inclination than her correlate to deny knowledge to someone in sceptical scenarios. From this evidence, the authors draw a conclusion about sceptical challenges, writing that if ’the defence of many of the premises used in arguments for scepticism comes to rest on an explicit or implicit appeal to intuition, then we can … conclude that the appeal of these sceptical arguments will be much more local than many philosophers suppose’. [243]

To this conclusion the authors anticipate the following reply: ’people who react differently to … sceptical intuition probes … should be viewed as having different epistemic concepts.’ [244] Those who have different intuitions from the sceptic or epistemologist, goes the reply, are working with different notions of knowledge and justification. In response, the authors end their paper with a challenge, ’Without some reason to think that what white, western, high socio-economic status philosophers call “knowledge” is any more valuable, desirable or useful than any of the other commodities that other groups call “knowledge” it is hard to see why we should care if we can’t have it.’ [245]. What is so wonderful, they ask, about this concept of knowledge that we spend so much time defending it against scepticism?

It is worth seeing that this question can be raised, and pressed, without any of the authors’ empirical findings suggesting a pluralism of epistemic concepts. Even if the sceptic’s epistemic concepts were universally held and utilized, who is to say that we must keep them? Why stick with the epistemic concepts we have, and continue to worry about scepticism? We can, at any time we wish, change our epistemic concepts so as to avoid sceptical arguments; indeed we could change them for any reason whatsoever—in a recent paper, Sally Haslanger discusses changing our epistemic concepts in order to reduce sexism in knowledge-attribution [Philosophical Perspectives, Vol. 13 (1999)]. The mere possibility of choosing to adopt new epistemic concepts raises the question with which Nichols, Stich, and Weinberg end their paper: what is so valuable about the concept with which epistemologists are concerned?

If there were something special about the state that western philosophers call ’knowledge’, then the sceptical conclusion—that this knowledge cannot be achieved—would be significant. Indeed, this conclusion would be significant even if no one uses this concept. If a state is a valuable state to attain, then it would be a noteworthy discovery that we could not have it, even if no one had ever used the notion of such a outside of philosophical discourse. So, while their empirical findings are intriguing, the challenge with which Nichols, Stich, and Weinberg end their paper in no way depends upon these findings.

Nichols, Stich, and Weinberg give us no reason to think that what the philosopher calls knowledge is not valuable. Accordingly, we can, and should, take their question as an open challenge, and not as a criticism. The sceptic needs to tell us why the state that he says that we cannot attain would be worth attaining. Epistemologists who spend so much time fighting the sceptic must do the same; why does it matter whether or not we can have what the sceptic tells us we cannot have? In the past few years, a handful of epistemologists have turned their attention to the value of knowledge. But, as far as I know, their work has not been informed by the challenge set by Nichols, Stich, and Weinberg. They have not answered the question, ’What is the value of knowledge qua the state that the sceptic says we cannot have?’ Once they do, and only once they do, will we come to see whether and why would it be significant if the sceptic were right.

Perhaps more importantly, answering the challenge set by Nichols, Stich, and Weinberg will describe the parameters of our responses to the sceptic. An acceptable answer to the sceptic will be one that either shows that we can indeed attain an epistemic state that is worth attaining, or that the sceptic does not show that we cannot attain this state. In any event, that state and its worth need to be described. We need to know what is so valuable about what we are supposedly saving, and we need to know what we can and cannot give up in our attempts to rescue our epistemic lives. The very range of responses to scepticism in The Skeptics—some of which claim that we must live with scepticism, some of which claim that it must be avoided at all costs—reveals that this question may be the most pressing in epistemology. While we clearly have a choice to stop worrying about the state that the ’white, western, high socio-economic status philosophers call “knowledge”’, we will do best to first figure out whether doing so would be to discard the baby instead of the bathwater.

3. Ayers: The Appeal and the Unacceptability of Scepticism

It is extraordinary that the real unacceptability of global sceptical arguments has generated so little discussion. We cannot adopt the conclusions of most global sceptical arguments; that this is so is revealed by the fact that the sceptical challenge—which says that we have no reason to believe something—does not lessen or weaken the beliefs the arguments target. This is true, notably, even among the staunchest defenders of scepticism; Barry Stroud once wrote, ’I would grant—indeed insist—that philosophical scepticism is not something we should seriously consider adopting or accepting (whatever that means)’ [Journal of Philosophy (1984)].

Descartes notes, at the end of the First Meditation, that ’My habitual opinions keep coming back, and, despite my wishes, they capture my belief … ’, but he ultimately makes nothing of it. Hume and, more recently, P.F. Strawson make a great deal of the unacceptability of scepticism, arguing that it shows something about our beliefs. If our beliefs are not affected by sceptical arguments, Hume and Strawson argue, then they must be supported by something other than reasons; they must be ’naturally’ determined. What each author neglects to consider, however, is that the inefficacy of sceptical challenges may derive not from the beliefs that sceptical challenge targets, but from the challenge itself. Global sceptical challenges may have some property that determines their unacceptability, and that property may in turn diffuse our need to worry about them.

In his contribution to this volume, ’What Are We to Say to the Cartesian Sceptic?’, Michael Ayers explores this route, focusing on the scope of sceptical arguments. Ayers argues that what he calls sceptical ’hypotheses’ (e.g., that I am a brain in a vat, that an evil demon exists) are ’far-fetched’. By this he does not mean that they are merely improbable; rather, sceptical hypotheses target so many of our beliefs that we are necessarily left without any basis from which to judge whether they are probable or not. He writes, the sceptical challenge ’leaves us no system of beliefs or body of knowledge … by reference to which these hypotheses could be judged … to be epistemic possibilities …’ If we were, per impossible, to accept the conclusion of a global sceptical argument, ’any hypothesis should appear as reasonable as any other or, which is perhaps the same thing, no hypothesis could be an explanation of anything.’ In this way, the enormous scope of sceptical challenges undercuts their own ability to be assessed; they themselves remove all ’seeming reasons for taking the hypothesis [upon which they depend] seriously’. [18]

This way with the sceptic is rather quick, but it has a good deal going for it. In particular, it allows us to explain the unacceptability of sceptical challenges without having to deny their apparent unanswerability. ’Sceptical-friendly’ contextualists like Lewis and Keith DeRose attempt to answer scepticism while explaining the apparent faultlessness of sceptical arguments. They argue, roughly, that while (i) sceptical challenges are epistemically allowable, (ii) the raising of a sceptical challenge changes the epistemic context. The first part of their position, (i), explains the unanswerability of scepticism: sceptical arguments are not violating any epistemic rules. The second part, (ii), allows the sceptical-friendly contextualist to claim that while we have knowledge in most contexts, we lose it when the sceptical challenge is raised (e.g., in the philosophy seminar room). But this position fails to explain why, even in the sceptic’s own context, we do not take sceptical arguments to heart. An allowable epistemic challenge should at least potentially affect our beliefs. However, even in their proper context, and taken seriously, sceptical challenges do not affect our beliefs. Even in the philosophy seminar room, I continue to believe wholeheartedly that I am in the philosophy seminar room.

Ayers’ position, by contrast, can explain both the appeal and the unanswerability of sceptical challenges. Like the contextualist, Ayers can allow that sceptical challenges are, except for their scope, allowable epistemic moves; they raise alternatives that we cannot eliminate, and in the face of such alternatives, it is reasonable to claim that we do not have knowledge. Thus their unanswerability. However, sceptical challenges are unacceptable because of their scope. They undercut so much knowledge at once that they leave us nothing by which we can assess their strength. Therefore, they can have no effect on our beliefs; an epistemic challenge that I cannot assess will be inert in my belief system. If this move were a good one, then it would allow us to push scepticism to one side, to declare it an inherently unanswerable challenge. This would open the door for us to go on and explore the source and authority of our perceptual and . priori knowledge, as Ayers himself does in the bulk of his paper.