The Social and Political Philosophy of Mary Wollstonecraft

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Sandrine Bergès and Alan Coffee (eds.), The Social and Political Philosophy of Mary Wollstonecraft, Oxford University Press 2017, 247 pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198766841.

Reviewed by Ruth Hagengruber, Paderborn University


Mary Wollstonecraft (1759-1797), a famous and prolific writer whose work was translated into several languages during her lifetime, reflected on the philosophical and political issues connected with the topics current at that time. Her ideas focus on important themes such as how a community organizes itself and what is wrong with the general positions of women in society. Today, her writing serves as an example of a proto-feminist approach which articulates this special problem of the sexes as an elementary moment in political philosophy. Nonetheless, although these issues have continued to be relevant, Wollstonecraft's position is debated within feminist theory. Her writings satisfy the claims of the feminist approach insofar as they contain a decisive critique of patriarchal dominion which points to political misogyny, presented in just as decisive a critique of Rousseau's double morals in his political representational claims and the educational and political model he had drafted for women. Rousseau's model excluded women from egalitarian participation, which was defended by Wollstonecraft in a general and radical claim for the participation of everyone, male or female.

What makes Wollstonecraft so controversial among feminist thinkers is, above all, her critique of women's weaknesses and their acceptance of their own slavery, seemingly begging for food instead of for freedom. Women, she wrote, subject themselves to domination, "creeping in the dust" and relinquishing their dignity. Consequently, Wollstonecraft's sisters in gender, emphasizing the need for unity among the suppressed sex, called Wollstonecraft herself a misogynist. This feminist critique pointed out the masculinity of (her) reasoning. One of their main arguments was that with reference to the ideal of reasonability, Wollstonecraft had denied or neglected the female perspective, the importance of otherness, in feminist political and social reasoning. Under this polemic arc, the authors of this collection have gathered material to sketch the current discussion on topics of feminist political and social philosophy.

With this background in mind, the contributions endeavor to engage with this outstanding writer. Wollstonecraft's thoughts are redefined in today's language, reflecting today's questions. The authors present a wide variety of perspectives on a group of texts which emerged at a time when questions that still occupy us today were articulated for the first time. Today these questions are subjected to a multi-faceted interpretation which arises from the problems we face today. The essays do not praise Wollstonecraft as the forerunner of proto-feminist ideas, nor do they interpret her as a self-confirmation of modern convictions. In general, a prudent approach to explaining and understanding Wollstonecraft's daring ideas is offered.

In reading Wollstonecraft today, and taking her thoughts into account from today's perspective, one is struck by the power of this philosopher. Leaving aside biased interpretations of female or male dichotomies, stigmatized political demands, or the extensively discussed reason-emotion dualism, we find a differentiated and deliberate presentation of Wollstonecraft's thoughts, which for that reason seem much more familiar to the philosopher of the 21st century. Beyond the one- dimensional justification of a feminist, or rationalist and therefore misogynist, philosopher of the 18th century, we discover a discussion beyond the pro or contra of sexist-driven politics.

Wollstonecraft's A Vindication of the Rights of Women (1792) is a standard text for feminist political philosophy and has become important and influential in this field. Wollstonecraft is a political philosopher who carried on discussions with contemporaries such as Edmund Burke, Thomas Paine and Catharine Macaulay at their levels. Wollstonecraft's writings were widely available then and still are today, a tradition nearly uninterrupted. Today her writings are also accessible as printed material and online. There is no doubt that this satisfies one of the main conditions for integrating her ideas into the canon of philosophy. Due to this easy and varied availability, the contributors do not quote from the same sources, which seems acceptable.

The collection is basically divided into three conceptual approaches. The editors start by presenting a somewhat chronological attempt at historic positioning -- papers occupied with Wollstonecraft's own references to historic political philosophy. Wollstonecraft's thoughts on classical authors are included. Plato, Aristotle and the Stoics frame this kind of deliberate reinterpretation and repositioning of Wollstonecraft's thoughts. Sylvana Tomaselli investigates the analysis of inequalities with regard to love, esteem and respect, referring hereby to the 18th century debates on platonic topics dealt with in the works of Burke and Price, and reviewed by Wollstonecraft in her journalistic analyses. This contextual re-positioning results in what has been called a more deliberate and differentiated approach, which does not allow the propagation of general claims such as the radical abolishment of inequality, as "she did not in fact seem to believe the eradication of the consequences of innate differences possible," as Tomaselli states (p. 17). Astonishing statements, among them that Wollstonecraft had never claimed "women were equal or unequal to men" are found and explained (p. 21). As inequality could only be identified with regard to the task of being a woman, Tomaselli tries to explain and to break through the dichotomist clusters of political and gender classification. Nancy Kendrick follows with an article rereading Wollstonecraft's interpretation of how a marriage should be conceptualized in a sphere of equality or complementarity, reflecting Aristotle's ideas on marriage and friendship (p. 49).

Finally, in the third article taking this historical approach, Martina Reuter definitely denies that the dichotomous clustering between reason and passion, mind and emotion, could contribute to an original understanding of Wollstonecraft's intentions. According to Reuther, Wollstonecraft's interpretation of passion and its strong dependency on reason demonstrates how she conceptualizes the dependency of reason on nature. This interpretation may be seen as a fundamental key to a new way of reading Wollstonecraft today -- as a kind of relational thinker, here traced back in her origins to one of her most admired idols, Catharine Macaulay, and to Macaulay's reference to the Stoics (p. 65).

The second part offers re-interpretations of social and political demands and expands on Wollstonecraft's ideas, which were constrained between individual liberty and egalitarian values. Catriona Mackenzie rebuts the earlier feminist critique of Wollstonecraft's "masculine" claim on autonomy and considers it a necessary precondition to a self-determined and meaningful life. Wollstonecraft's interpretation of women as both despots and slaves "allowed her to look beyond slavery as a relation of total powerlessness on one side and total power on the other, and to open up the space for complicated questions of complicity, resistance, and agency" (p. 134). The author shows that a one-dimensional understanding of Wollstonecraft cannot do justice to her dynamic and particularized point of view. Beyond all defensible critique of a patriarchal suppression, Wollstonecraft focuses on the ideal of the individualist as a central democratic endowment for citizenship (p. 69). Rights and duties, sketched out by Wollstonecraft and compared to Burke, Rousseau, Bentham, Kant and others, allow the reader to experience her thoughts through the canonical classics in the discussion of rights for women, children and animals (p. 92).

The colletion concludes with essays on republicanism, a topic widely discussed by women philosophers of the early modern period. From the early 18th century with Mary Astell until the end of the century, whether in England with Catharine Macaulay, or in France, where Olympe de Gouges and Sophie de Grouchy publically took part in the discussion, the prolific outcome of women's contributions to this topic has become widely acknowledged. In fact, Karen Green has pointed out that the political democratic movement cannot be satisfactorily understood unless the writings of women are taken into account.[1] Women's protest about having been systematically excluded from the benefits of citizenship and deprived of their voices is a core theme of that period, shared by women as well as male intellectuals.

Philip Pettit continues with ideas on the question of domination in marriage using Ibsen's play, A Doll's House. Susan James delivers a fruitful comparison of Wollstonecraft's concept of rights in her Vindication of the Rights of Men and the Vindication of the Rights of Women, two main volumes published within two years of each other. Answering the general claim that the second book does not treat the concept of rights at all, James offers a conceptual interpretation of what Wollstonecraft determines rights to mean in the specific context of women's divestment in the political area. The reader's perspective on Wollstonecraft is broadened by the introduction of the role of natural rights and natural law as functional elements of Wollstonecraft's republican idea of liberty (p. 163). Lena Halldenius concludes this part by insisting that political representation is not symbolic but the claim for a "direct share in government" (p. 181).

Particularly in the closing contributions of the editors, but also in the general framework of the book, the philosophy of Wollstonecraft is presented in the context of current discussions, from a feminist as well as from a general political perspective. The collection abandons the schemata of fruitless one-dimensional interpretations that position Wollstonecraft as either a proto-feminist or a rationalist misogynist. Her feminist ideas are embedded in a broader reflection that begins by retracing her sources back to the classics, and follows by positioning her thoughts with the republican ideas of natural laws, pointing to the relevance of her ideas in identifying questions about particular rights and duties in a socially and politically diverse society. Moreover, the collection shows the necessity of an exegesis of the philosophy of women. It confirms Wollstonecraft as an inspirational writer of the Enlightenment period whose ideas sketch out future concepts, the relevance of which scholars are only beginning to discover. The importance of her writing on the perspectives of women's issues in the broader republican and democratic context, the question of representation and egalitarian participation, are becoming increasingly necessary for feminism, and therefore for the political discussion as a whole.

[1] Karen Green. A History of Women’s Political Thought in Europe, 1700-1800. Cambridge University Press 2014, p.2.