Technosystem: The Social Life of Reason

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Andrew Feenberg, Technosystem: The Social Life of Reason, Harvard University Press, 2017, 235 pp., $35.00, ISBN 9780674971783.

Reviewed by Claudio Corradetti, University of Rome, Tor Vergata


Andrew Feenberg has a life research project, namely, the revival of critical theory in line with the premises of the first generation of the Frankfurt School. In this book he moves to reflecting carefully on advanced industrial societies, a topic already addressed by Marcuse, Feenberg's master, in his most celebrated work One-Dimensional Man (1964). For Marcuse, in advanced industrial societies, technological rationality is political rationality.[1] This assumption is also at the basis of Feenberg's proposal.

Accordingly, Feenberg wants to renew reflection on advanced industrial societies by appealing to a new conceptual socio-political category: the technosystem. But what specifically does he mean by "technosystem"? First, the technosystem is "a field of technical practices aimed at control of the environment" (p.159), where there is no separation between the sociotechnical world and society in general. For Feenberg, following early critical social theory, processes of functionalization are always culturally embedded and understanding the technosystem requires an all-embracing theory of society. Society consists of three institutional components, each characterized by its own specific rationality: markets (relations of equivalences), administrations (relations of the universal rule to the particular case) and technologies (relations of efficiency through performance, measurement etc.). Through a revised instrumentalization theory, Feenberg maintains that the technosystem "challenges the supposed isolation of sociotechnical rationality" (p.159). But to this purpose, the technosystem is made to rely upon a notion of critical constructivism.

For Feenberg, critical constructivism is at the core of the reformulation of the critical theory paradigm since, on the one hand, it shares with the Frankfurt School the "critique of modernity" (p.40) whereas, on the other hand, it shares with Foucault the "critique of context-free rationality" (p.40). Critical constructivism presents itself as an intellectual counter-paradigm for contrasting the hegemonic threats of the technosystem (p.38). In chapter two, Feenberg gets to the core of the problem. Critical constructivism, while relying on "constructivist science and technological studies" (p.44), rejects the sharp Habermasian division between system and life-world, and thus the separation between instrumental and communicative rationality (p.43). For Feenberg, the technosystem reveals that these two societal dimensions of rationality of instrumental and non-instrumental reason (one of 'mutual understanding') are inextricably linked together.

As a theory, critical constructivism relies also in part on a notion of social constructivism (p.45), where "technological designs" reflect the interpretation provided by social actors. Here, different social actors may assign alternative functionalities to the same technologies without the need to rely on common efficiency criteria. Efficiency is not an absolute standard, but depends on socially contingent factors (p.59). Feenberg speaks of a "constructivist principle of symmetry" (p.46) in order to recast in a non-hierarchical way those forms of competing rationalities that promote certain technological objects on the basis of socially contingent preferences. Actors and objects are always "in networks" and never to be seen according to a subject/object opposition (p.47). Here Feenberg bases his notion on the idea of a co-production, something he develops in the introduction. The principle of constructivist symmetry is important in so far as it relinquishes a flux of knowledge that is activated also at the level of lay citizens, not just of experts. This allows for the possibility of citizens to activate processes of critical emancipation from capitalist domination and to advance democratic reforms: "social struggle is technical struggle" (p.53).

Turning to the sections of the book, in the introduction the author opens with a philosophically strong assumption against a strict opposition between facts and values. As Feenberg affirms: "values are the facts of the future" (p.8) and "technologies are the crystallized expression of those values" (p.8). Accordingly, he sees modern society as resulting from the activity of co-production between "social identities and worlds" (p.9). To exemplify the concept, Feenberg refers to Escher's print Drawing Hands. Here the idea of co-production emerges from the optical play of hands mutually bringing themselves to reciprocal appearance. Yet, in reality, the observer is never externally situated as she is when judging the work, and thus the co-imbrication between society and technology falls always within finitude. This view of society is crucial to capture the inherent paradox of democracy, namely, the idea that self-rule is a co-productive activity by technically shaped subjects deciding upon which technical systems to adopt. This is a paradox that shapes contemporary critical understanding of democracy understood from post-metaphysical premises. The consequence of such a view is that there is no ultimate truth which can be vindicated from a perspective of co-production. What Feenberg calls "the two natures" of experience and natural science can never be ordered in a hierarchical form; they engage, rather, in a dialectical exchange in an unlimited process of co-definition (p.14).

The main constituting sections are organized into three parts: Method, Application and Theory. In the section on method, the author lays his cards on the table by presenting his understanding of the relation between Foucault and Marx in critical terms. His view is also presented through an attempt to integrate the analysis of the technosystem with actor-network theory (ANT) as well as with the work of a scholar less know in the Anglophone world, namely, with Simondon's ideas on technical progress as based on non-(societal) relational concepts (p.67). Feenberg notes that for most of these thinkers rationality never comes in singular terms, but it takes many forms, according to the different social contexts in which it appears. It is also in this context that he introduces the central concepts of "critical constructivism" as well as the revision of the actor-network theory (ANT).

With regard to the fruitful relation between Foucault and Marx, Feenberg addresses the link between power/knowledge at the center of Foucault's reflection on domination and bio-politics. For Foucault, regimes of truth are never independent from regimes of power. As Feenberg notes, the Enlightenment, with the sole exception of Rousseau, failed to propose a standard of emancipation capable of overcoming standards of domination. It was only with Marx's criticism of political economy and of "the impersonal domination of the market" (p.21) that such an objective was first accomplished. Therefore, the critically productive relation between Marx and Foucault must also be revived today.

As to technology, for Foucault this is one of the many ways in which domination is realized, as in the control exercised by the Panopticon. Acutely, Feenberg observes that here there is no separation between object and function, so that the Panopticon "is its function . . . the exercise of power through surveillance" (p.30). Similarly, Marx saw technology in a non-deterministic form and as a contingent element defined by social relations.

All in all, Feenberg's reflections on societal and political economic targets shared by Foucault and Marx point to the possibility of overcoming the internal contradictions of capitalist societies. But here he advances a new suggestion: not just an increased form of democratic legitimation, but something yet to be seen: a model of socialist governmentality moving away from simple infra-democratic reformations (p.35). This point would have benefited from more discussion.

In the section which follows, Feenberg discusses an applied case: the Internet. He asks, "Can market rationality coexist peacefully on the Internet with communicative rationality?" (p.87). There is, according to the author, too high of an expectation for the democratic possibilities of the internet: "a hype" (p.89). Information society is the basis of current advanced capitalism, but for Feenberg there is no simple equation between knowledge producers as exploited subjects. Capitalism profits from many activities that are not necessarily equitable with labor in a Marxian sense; similarly, the Internet cannot be assessed in traditional labor-exploitative terms. Feenberg proposes a different view. The Internet is first "a technical system" (p.99) which realizes meaningful functions in accordance with the pretenses of its users. There are five features characterizing the model: (1) a non-hierarchical structure, (2) anonymity, (3) broadcasting, (4) data storage, and (5) many-to-many communication. Altogether, they serve a multiplicity of function-strategies in accordance with the different actors involved. Yet, the Internet fulfills also a purely non-instrumental function as a public space for discussion and deliberation (p.107).

In the final section, dedicated to theory, Feenberg examines the nature of rationality itself as an element of the technosystem. Part of this task consists in the refoundation of the relation between critical theory and the social sciences, as well as in the reformulation of the significance of socio-historical progress. Following Don Ihde's suggestion, he considers the opportunity to shift the understanding of modernity by means of a "gestalt switch", a change from within technological culture where values are institutionally inherent elements in the same technosystem. Again, there is no meaningful separation between facts and values. This illusion entrapped the first generation of critical theorists into a non-transcendable form of transcendent capitalism where no immanent gestalt switch could be possibly conceived. But what then prompts the activation of gestalt switches? Feenberg points to two important directions. The first consists in identifying the concrete obstacles that affect cognitive changes. This leads to Lukács' analysis of reifications in the capitalist system. Gestalt switches go hand in hand with processes of dereification.

The second pattern is that which points to an Arendtian political reinterpretation of Kant's reflective judgment: "Judgement dereifies what were formerly understood as absolutes " (p.131). Judgment also serves the purpose of proposing an alternative framework of critical contestation to the Habermasian rationalization of public deliberations through the use of rhetoric. As the author promptly recognizes: "Reflective judgment crosses the usual boundary between personal preferences and shared and grounded beliefs. This is the domain of rhetoric, not science" (p.163). The author engages with current debates in post-Arendtian interpretations of reflective judgment and exemplarity and, more decidedly, he supplements with deep philosophical insight current theories on the structure of public debate. This latter topic seems a particularly fruitful one for understanding the practical import of Feenberg's proposal. The "phronetic" background providing the hermeneutical presupposition for solving societal conflicts between institutional procedures and a non-reconciliable plurality of values must be understood as a result of practices occurring within a technosystem. It is starting from actual struggles within the technosystem that there emerges a phronetic background out of which it becomes possible to make reflective judgments which, in turn, furnish an enlarged perspective on conflicts. I would notice here that a hint to Feenberg's direction of analysis is already present in Marcuse when he, echoing Kant, affirms that "technology would become subject to the free play of faculties in the struggle for the pacification of nature and of society".[2] But whereas in Marcuse the reference to Kant's play of imagination and intellect occupies a marginal role, in Feenberg  it becomes quite a central notion. I wonder whether, though, this puts the author in an advantageous position. Indeed, one might suspect that Feenberg's ideas of a gestalt switch and reflective judgment suffer from a non-remediable flow. Namely, they lack dialectical drive, thus opening a dangerous space to unintended anti-Marcusian one-dimensional reifications. It is not clear, indeed, how Feenberg's phronetic apparatus could maintain the normative negativity that Marcuse recognizes in judgment, as when he affirms that "The copula 'is' states an 'ought', a desideratum".[3] This is not to say that Feenberg cannot accommodate confrontational agonism of reasons but, rather, that such opposition would eventually remain external both on the level of thought and of reality. In brief, it would not be dialectical.

The book's conclusion adds quite interesting reflections and draws significant consequences from previously developed arguments. The author proposes an alternative idea of progress to that of rational universalism, one based on "local" improvements (p. 187), where change is primarily in the technosystem rather than in the legal or political side (p.190). This is interestingly in line with Marcuse's argument on "technical progress as the instrument of domination".[4] A notion of a non-trenspassability of context is defended. Here, "contextualism about normative validity" (p.189) is developed primarily through the idea of a non-transcendent, context-free point of adjudication where values remain always justifiable -- and contestable -- notions within given contexts.

As mentioned at the beginning of this review, the concept of technosystem aims at introducing an alternative framework to traditional critical social theory. As Feenberg boldly observes, the technosystem "is no ordinary object of empirical study. It is the framework of our existence" (p.203). A framework where, as I have highlighted, the intention of the author is that of overcoming the classical, Habermasian, separation between instrumental and normative reason. From this move Feenberg derives a host of conceptual consequences and transformative political strategies. One of these considers that it is exactly because there can be no possibility of disjoining technical and moral reason that progress is always both technical and moral (p.203). For the author, this final point revives the hope for general human emancipation through technological improvements, but the political contours of a new phase of civil advancement are yet to be unveiled.

I conclude this 'engaged' exposition of Feenberg's book by noticing that the author has certainly achieved its purposes and contributed to the revival of critical theory. Yet, I would still keep open the question on whether some of the theses he presents do advance our normative understanding and critical appraisals of emancipatory, freedom-generating, a priori presuppositions of societal life.  Here I have particularly in mind Feenberg's criticism of the Habermasian separation of system and lifeworld and their different forms of rationality. I believe that there is still much to be discussed here, but certainly the effects of a reinvigorated debate on critical theory is the most that can be asked to a book of this sort.

[1] On this point see H.Marcuse, One-Dimensional Man. Studies in the Ideology of Advanced Industrial Societies, Routledge, [1964], 2002, p. xlvi (from the ‘Introduction’ to the first edition).

[2]Ibid., p. 18.

[3] Ibid., p.137.

[4] Ibid., p.46.