The Socratic Paradox and Its Enemies

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Roslyn Weiss, The Socratic Paradox and Its Enemies, University of Chicago Press, 2006, 235pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 0226891720.

Reviewed by Sung-Hoon Kang, Seoul National University


Roslyn Weiss's The Socratic Paradox and Its Enemies presents a novel and ambitious interpretation of the familiar Socratic paradoxes: that virtue is knowledge, that all the virtues are one, and that no one does wrong willingly. According to Weiss, the common interpretation of these paradoxes are not really "Socratic" in the sense that Socrates himself holds those views. Socrates does not intellectualize virtue; what he means by the claim that virtue is knowledge is only that virtuous people choose virtue wisely. Socrates does not believe that the parts of virtue such as justice, temperance, courage, etc. are manifestations of a single moral craft; he only believes that these virtues are all required for a life rightly lived. And most importantly, Socrates does not make the implausible claim that no one who knows what is right does wrong and thus every wrongdoing involves some kind of error.  He rather maintains that bad people do wrong intentionally either because they are overcome by their passions or appetites or because they think injustice is to their advantage, and that these bad people are blameworthy because they can (and should) overcome their desires and fears, and they can (and should) act against what they believe is to their advantage in case doing that involves doing bad things.

So, if Weiss is right, the views Socrates actually holds are not really paradoxical at all. It is true that they are often presented in rather paradoxical forms. But that is only because, Weiss claims, Socrates is reacting rather vigorously against the views held by his opponents, the "enemies" of justice. Weiss draws the reader's attention to various passages in Platonic dialogues where war-imagery is used, and suggests that Socrates is a fighter in a war for justice. Various dialogues are battlefields, so to speak, and Socrates takes on a different tactic in accordance with the opponent in each battle. In order to win the battle, Socrates sometimes overstates his case, sometimes arguing for conclusions that he regards as false, and sometimes even intentionally misleading his opponent in order to trap him. As a result, Weiss contends, "not every Socratic utterance is a Socratic view, and not every Socratic utterance that is a Socratic view means what it seems to mean" (p.8).

In order to understand and appreciate what Socrates really means by his paradox-like statements, then, one would have to pay close attention to the contexts in which Socrates presents them. The main body of Weiss's book is devoted to this task. Weiss claims that the core of the so-called Socratic paradoxes is the dictum "no one does wrong willingly" (rather than the more popular maxim "virtue is knowledge"). And she examines six Platonic dialogues where some versions of this dictum can be found: Protagoras, Gorgias, Hippias Minor, Meno, Republic 4, and Laws 9. Weiss's interpretation of these individual dialogues is always thought-provoking and at times quite illuminating (e.g., her discussion and comparison of Polus and Callicles in the Gorgias). Her exposition is quite clear, so the reader knows exactly when he/she disagrees with Weiss's interpretation. And it seems there is a lot to disagree with. Her identifications of the contexts and of Socrates' intentions in those contexts are all very controversial. Since she argues very carefully, it would take too long to discuss in detail all my disagreements with her interpretations of the individual dialogues. Instead, I will focus on some problems of Weiss's general interpretative premises, which I think is more important because the success of her overall project depends ultimately on her interpretative assumptions.

Taking contexts into consideration is, in itself, an impeccable principle. But we need to exercise caution here. There is a chance that the practice may degenerate into what might be called a systematic misunderstanding. Context is supposed to help us determine the correct reading of a certain passage. But one's understanding (or misunderstanding) of certain passages may affect his/her identification of the context. Thus, a good interpretative practice involves taking a balanced approach both to the passages and to the context. But it is unclear if Weiss takes a balanced approach; she seems to put too much emphasis on contexts and reads into the text her own understanding of Socrates' project.

Weiss's identification of contexts is guided by the following two questions.  (1) Why is Socrates set up against the particular interlocutors that he converses with in various dialogues?  (2) Why does Socrates put forward "ridiculous" views and bad arguments in the dialogues?

The first question is indeed an important one. Posing it is perhaps Weiss's major contribution. But her answer to this question is rather simple: they are sophists, or influenced by sophists, who basically hold that no one is willingly just,[1] and Socrates has a mission to overturn their views. Although this answer may well be true as far as it goes, it does not seem to do full justice to richer and subtler dramatic contexts of various dialogues. If Socrates' objective is simply to refute this sophistic manifesto, it is unclear why Socrates has to deal with different sophists in the various dialogues.  Wouldn't one dialogue be sufficient for this purpose?[2] It is undeniable that there were some common grounds among sophists at the time, but it is also true that individual sophists had their own distinctive positions (e.g., Protagoras is not a Callicles, to say the least). Socrates' attack on his opponents seems subtler and more complex than Weiss's wholesale treatment suggests. To be fair, Weiss does note individual differences among different interlocutors. But she relies heavily on character analyses that are based on minute details such as passing remarks and different wordings -- subtle hints that Plato has allegedly dropped for the reader. Again, I'm not denying the dramatic importance of these things. But we need to put them in perspective. Character analysis is only a part of a full-scale dramatic analysis, and the minute details Weiss focuses on are open to other interpretations (e.g. I find Weiss's harsh characterizations of Meno and Hippias, and to a lesser degree of Protagoras, to be a bit strained).

Weiss's answer to the second question consists of two parts:  (1) Socrates is not committed to those ridiculous views and bad arguments, and (2) he nonetheless puts them forward because he is on a mission that he cannot afford to lose and those views and arguments are tactically useful for winning. Weiss's main focus throughout the book is on showing how they are tactically useful. On the other hand, surprisingly less effort is devoted to showing that Socrates is indeed not committed to them, though of course this is the presupposition of Weiss's entire project. Weiss seems to be content with showing that it is not impossible to take Socrates as not committed to those views and arguments -- and she is often quite ingenious at this task. Obviously, however, this does not constitute a good reason to think positively that Socrates is indeed not committed to them.

Weiss's reasoning behind being content with this seems to be based on the principle of charity:  if what Socrates says seems ridiculous, we should believe that he means something other than what he says, if we can construe him in some other way. Needless to say, there have been a lot of scholars who think that what Socrates says is not ridiculous but demands deep philosophical engagement (even if ultimately it turns out to be false). More importantly, the Socrates that emerges from Weiss's interpretation is not exactly an attractive figure -- something hard to square with the principle of charity. In the following I will indicate some unattractive aspects of Weiss's Socrates. Of course, the fact that Weiss's Socrates is an unattractive figure is not in itself a good argument against her interpretation. But when her unorthodox picture of Socrates is ultimately motivated by the principle of charity, I believe it is a fair criticism.

First of all, Weiss’s Socrates unabashedly uses bad arguments. Admittedly, Plato does have Socrates use bad arguments, if by "bad arguments" we mean invalid ones. But bad arguments in themselves may not be so bad ad hominem. Contexts may help us fill in some hidden premises in the arguments, often ones that only the interlocutors are committed to. I believe one important job of commentators is to reveal such hidden premises. (And, as I understand it, this is the principle of charity combined with taking contexts into account.) Weiss takes a slightly but significantly different approach. On her account, too, Socrates' bad arguments are not "bad" ad hominem; they are good for winning against the opponent.[3] Weiss's Socrates is not so much concerned about whether or not his argument is a non-sequitur. His main concern is whether or not it is effective for his purpose.

This brings us to the second feature of Weiss's Socrates: he is not a genuine seeker of truth. With regard to moral questions, he thinks he knows pretty much everything he needs to know and has it all figured out. So finding out the truth is not among his motivations for discussing with his interlocutors. This Socrates is a dogmatist who is so confident in his beliefs that he controls, manipulates, and cheats his interlocutors. It is worth noting that, if Socrates is assumed to be a genuine seeker of truth, he can be presented to hold different (tentative) views in different dialogues. In that case, we can say that Socrates holds some core moral beliefs, such as that justice is an essential element of a good life, but tries hard to justify those beliefs by figuring things out through discussion with various people including, of course, sophists. This would be a nice alternative to Weiss's Socrates, who is not interested in justification and cheats in order to win.

What is most disturbing about Weiss's Socrates is that he does wrong (cheating) in the name of justice. As I understand it, a just person is not a person for whom winning is everything: how to win is more important for him/her. Perhaps Weiss is right that Socrates as a just person cannot afford to lose against the enemy of justice. Still, that doesn't mean that he would use any means to achieve his goal. On the contrary, he would be all the more concerned about the means because resorting to unjust means is already a way of losing to the enemy of justice. On the familiar traditional picture of Socrates, of course, he would think that he doesn't have to resort to unjust means because he firmly believes that justice (and truth) does have power in itself and that injustice never pays. Indeed, resorting to unjust means would be a stupidity according to what he preaches through the Socratic paradoxes. On the new Weissian picture of Socrates, he would think that he ought not to resort to unjust means because he is a Kantian who believes that one ought not to do wrong even if it pays. So either way, resorting to unjust means cannot be endorsed by Socrates.

Weiss’s discussion of punishment in Laws 9 (chapter 7) and her conclusion (chapter 8) suggest that she would say, as she should, that Socrates is not using unjust means. This is puzzling, however, because according to her interpretation what Socrates achieves in the discussion with his interlocutors is only "cheap verbal victory" (p.87) through cheating and manipulating. Weiss claims that "elenchus is painful … it is a form of punishment" and that "Socrates regards such treatment … as just treatment" (pp.212-3). Although I am not sure if that is all there is to elenchus, I can agree on her point that elenchus is a form of punishment and "a shame therapy" (p.213), but only on condition that elenchus doesn't get reduced to mere verbal victory. The mere fact that you lose a case does not necessarily bring shame on you. After all, Socrates lost his trial, but he wasn't shamed as a result. Only the real loss, that you are truly shown to have been in the wrong, can bring shame on you. Then, and only then, can elenchus be said to be a form of just punishment.

Of course, whether or not you actually feel ashamed is a different matter.[4] Even when you are truly defeated you may not feel ashamed. But that only shows that you are hopelessly wrong. Conversely, even a mere verbal victory may make you feel ashamed. So perhaps it is useful for retributive purposes. But for Socrates (or Plato), just punishment is never a mere retribution. Punishment is justified on broadly utilitarian grounds: it promotes justice both in the soul of the ones who get punished and in the soul of the ones who watch them punished. But it is hardly likely that promotion of justice is achieved through mere verbal victory. If Plato were presenting Socrates as winning a mere verbal victory, he would be sending a wrong message: the sophists lost not necessarily because they were in the wrong but because they were less competent in their sophistry.

As I said, it is true that even real victory through elenchus may not shame the opponent into becoming a better person. After all, Socrates often fails to convert the champions of injustice into pursuers of justice with the method of elenchus, as is shown most clearly with Callicles.[5] Thus, in a way Socrates fails as a moral reformer. But in this respect Weissian Socrates' verbal victory is no different. One who doesn't feel ashamed by the real defeat will not feel ashamed by the verbal defeat, either. So in either case, Socrates occasionally fails. But the failure of the traditional Socrates is at least a noble failure.

I don't think this book is meant for the general public: Weiss argues skillfully for her unorthodox positions, but does not give enough background, or grounds, to explain the wide acceptance of the standard views. This is perfectly all right -- one cannot do everything in one book. This book instead provokes and invites reactions from other scholars. But, in the end, it seems it can appeal only to those scholars who share Weiss's presuppositions and want to save Socrates from the "ridiculous" paradoxes. Those who think those paradoxes are not ridiculous cannot endorse Weiss's whole project.

[1] Weiss observes that this view is epitomized by Glaucon in Republic II.357a-357e (p.11). 

[2] If we hold that Socrates is presented by Plato as developing his views through different dialogues, we will have an explanation (at least a partial one). But Weiss doesn't think that is the case. In fact, she thinks that one merit of her interpretation is to "[free] Plato from the "developmentalist hypothesis"" (p.2 n.5).

[3] Some commentators have argued that Socrates sometimes uses fallacious arguments intentionally. Weiss goes one step further and claims that Socrates uses bad arguments in order to win.

[4] In fact, the difference between being ashamed and feeling ashamed and other parallel differences lie in the heart of the Socratic paradoxes (as I understand them).

[5] That is one reason why Plato introduces stories (muthoi) and noble lies in early moral education, which would help children to form right characters. So, there is no analogy between noble lies and refutation by cheating.