The Socratic Way of Life: Xenophon's Memorabilia

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Thomas L. Pangle, The Socratic Way of Life: Xenophon's Memorabilia, University of Chicago Press, 2018, 288pp., $35.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780226516899.

Reviewed by David M. Johnson, Southern Illinois University Carbondale


Pangle's book is, in form, method, and substance, a new version of the commentary on Xenophon's Memorabilia published by his teacher, Leo Strauss, as the main part of Strauss's 1972 book Xenophon's Socrates. Like his master, Pangle offers close readings of each chapter of Xenophon's work, employing all the techniques familiar to readers of Straussian scholarship.

This is an impressive book, full of fine insights and close observations, clearly and engagingly written. It is not nearly as obscure as Strauss's late work on Xenophon, making Pangle's book the most accessible Straussian account of Xenophon's Socrates available to us. Refreshingly, Pangle does disagree with Strauss on some matters, sometimes explicitly. Pangle also includes frequent citations of secondary scholarship, unlike Strauss, including references to many "conventional," i.e., non-Straussian, scholars. But Pangle's approach and his conclusions are in keeping with those of Strauss, and most readers will judge Pangle's book based on their view of the merits of the Straussian approach.

While Pangle frequently cites Strauss, he rather curiously (or perhaps esoterically?) does not directly address his debt to him, or the similarity of his book to Strauss's. Instead he begins with Nietzsche (also a thinker of great importance for Strauss). Nietzsche found in Xenophon's Socrates a "wisdom full of roguish trickery" (1), and trickery, if not roguishness, will be a key theme in Pangle's book. In Pangle's view, Nietzsche's ambitions, as those of modern philosophy as a whole, broke with the humbler aims of classical, Socratic philosophizing, which "conceives the critical study of moral opinions and human psychology as the key to unraveling the universe's greatest mystery" (3). Despite its apparent humility, Socratic scrutiny itself led to a way of life that was "restlessly skeptical and meditative" (4), though Xenophon's caution has obscured this for most readers, who fail to penetrate the "cloak of boy-scout-like earnestness with which Xenophon playfully envelops his, and his Socrates's, radically free spirits" (1). So Socrates' free spirit has more in common with Nietzsche's than one might have expected; perhaps Pangle is roguish after all.

After a few tantalizing pages of such broad observations, Pangle turns to close commentary, the formula for the rest of his book. Like Strauss, Pangle is as interested in the "how" as the "what." We thus find numerous observations on nuances of Xenophontic language, especially oaths (all of which Pangle curiously regards as "profane"), transitional phrases, and authorial asides. Pangle gives a great deal of attention to the arrangement of episodes, something often found wanting by conventional readers of the Memorabilia. This is sometimes revelatory, as when Pangle traces the association of thought that lies behind the seemingly random collection of topics in Memorabilia 3.9.

Pangle also gives as much attention to the seemingly banal passages about topics like physical fitness as he does to more obviously philosophical parts of the work. He plausibly suggests that such passages are best read in an Aristophanean spirit. One of his key aims is, indeed, to identify Xenophon's tone; in Pangle's view Xenophon is generally writing with tongue in cheek, so the tone varies from broader to more restrained forms of irony. Pangle, perhaps wisely, speaks of humor and wit rather than irony; the former may be somewhat easier to pin down than the latter. But it is difficult to make the case that an author's tongue is consistently planted in his cheek. Is Xenophon never as earnest as he seems? If Pangle found more variety in tone he could have identified clues to show which passages were meant to elicit grins from knowing readers. Instead wry wit is everywhere; the presence of "profane oaths" may show that the wit is broader, but their absence reveals only mock seriousness. This is not to deny that some writers have a chronic case of tongue in cheek; it is only to suggest that it is a difficult diagnosis to confirm.

All informed readers recognize that Xenophon was writing apologetically, defending Socrates, and that this introduces a certain amount of special pleading. But for Pangle, Xenophon's defense of Socrates is not merely forensic but esoteric. So Socrates' most important views always lie some distance off stage. The sacra sacrorum for Pangle include disquieting questions about the gods and the noble (kalon). Socrates' theology in Memorabilia 1.4 and 4.3 does indeed suggest a far less personal conception of divinity than that endorsed by conventional belief, something one need not be a Straussian to recognize. But precisely because this theology is overt, it cannot, for Pangle, be the last word. He suggests that what looks like the argument from design in those passages may in fact have been an attempt to replace the gods with natural law. Certainly the argument from design had not yet become a bulwark of conventional religiosity in Socrates' day -- but this sort of historical consideration is not of great interest to Pangle.

There is a striking utilitarian strand in Xenophon's Socrates. This strand may in itself be unconventional, even radical -- something that Pangle does not consider, perhaps being too conventional to catch a radical element in Xenophon.[1] Be that as it may, Pangle argues that Xenophon's Socrates does not identify the noble with the good, much less with the useful. Nor does the noble consist of the honorable pursuit of the ability to benefit oneself, one's friends, and one's city, as many of Socrates' interlocutors assume -- an assumption which Xenophon's Socrates appears to endorse. It rather consists in theoretical investigation, including investigation of the what-is questions about ethics (Memorabilia 1.1.16). This interest in definitional questions makes it easier to assimilate Xenophon's Socrates to Plato's. Pangle does not often raise the issue of the relationship between Xenophon and Plato, but when he does he suggests that any differences are in presentation rather than in substance.

The pursuit of ethical questions is thus part of what Pangle means by the Socratic way of life. But for Pangle Socrates' way of life is ultimately no more transparent than his beliefs. At times, Pangle suggests that it consists precisely of the sorts of conversations that make up the bulk of the Memorabilia: seemingly mundane chats with non-philosophic types which, for those with ears to hear, are actually wry deconstructions of conventional values. Xenophon does make it clear that Socrates sometimes spoke with one interlocutor for the benefit not of that interlocutor but of others in his audience. But it is hard to see just what Socrates himself gained from speaking with such unpromising interlocutors, or why this sort of conversation was the best way to benefit more promising companions. Pangle does, to his credit, raise this question, but he does not address the all too obvious answers more conventional scholars would consider. For perhaps Xenophon was genuinely interested in matters like military leadership and physical fitness as something other than targets for Socratic ironizing; and perhaps Xenophon's Socrates really was trying to benefit his interlocutors, rather than attempting to reveal to others how ridiculous the interlocutors' views were.

Pursuit of the what-is questions about the human things would be a higher activity than mundane conversations about practical matters. Xenophon says that Socrates was always pursuing such questions, but Pangle seems to believe that Xenophon never shows Socrates pursuing them. Pangle argues that the discussion of key terms in Memorabilia 3.9 is not fully theoretical, as wisdom there is merely practical wisdom, and the definitions of 4.6 are tailored to the severe limitations of Euthydemus. Xenophon does provide hints of Socrates' higher activities, above all the joint examination of wise old books with friends (Memorabilia 1.6.14). Pangle characterizes this as "a peak activity," which shows that Socrates could not only lead his companions toward virtue but also enable them to act virtuously (60). Those old books would, by definition, have been Presocratic, and thus, Pangle concludes, would have been concerned with nature. For Pangle this means that study of these books would in some ways transcend Socrates' discussion of the human what-is questions.

So there is an inner esoteric level beyond the already hidden investigation of the human things. This involves Socratic investigation of nature, which we see most clearly in Socrates' criticisms of the Presocratics following Xenophon's disingenuous claim that Socrates never discussed the cosmos as the others did (Memorabilia 1.1.11) -- meaning that Socrates did discuss the cosmos, but did so in a different way. Socrates pointed out that some Presocratics argue that only one thing exists, while others posit a limitless number of beings; some argue that nothing changes, while others argue that everything changes; some argue that nothing ever comes into being or passes way, while others argue that all that is always is. From this Pangle, following Strauss, deduces that in Socrates' moderate ontology "the beings, including most importantly ourselves, come to sight as mutable and mortal individuals whose existence is structured by evidently unchanging, and some even eternal, species or forms, including the logical and the mathematical forms" (20).

This discovery of a positive ontology from Socrates' questioning of the Presocratics is rather astonishing. It is obviously inspired by Plato's theory of forms -- something Strauss and Pangle are eager to find covert reference to in Xenophon, given their belief that Xenophon and Plato are ultimately on the same page. But of course the theory of forms, being exoteric, cannot be the whole story either. Pangle argues that the human things, the answers to the what-is questions, are not "beings" in this sense. They are rather "moral and political qualities or relationships (including the association that is the polis) that belong to or characterize human beings and their life." Thus we will not have forms of the virtues or of the beautiful (kalon). It is only in logic and mathematics that we have stability of the sort promised by Platonic forms.

By this point we have ventured into areas where one can only agree with Pangle that Xenophon and his Socrates are very unforthcoming. This makes it difficult for readers not only to evaluate Pangle's own views, but to be certain that we are asking questions Xenophon's Socrates thought to ask. This is, of course, one of the challenges presented by any esoteric reading.

What we can evaluate is Pangle's close reading of the text, and I close with an effort to analyze Pangle's take (164-168) on one key passage from the Memorabilia, the beginning of book four. Book four presents Xenophon's most ambitious account of Socratic teaching. Socrates first wins over and then instructs the young Euthydemus, whom conventional scholars regard as a model student. Xenophon says that once Socrates had seen that Euthydemus was willing to submit to a refutation and still return for more, "he confused him as little as possible, but most simply and clearly explained to him what he thought one needed to know and what were the best things for one to do" (4.2.40). On its face, then, the education of Euthydemus would appear to be a frontal challenge to the esoteric interpretation of Xenophon.

Pangle, though, argues that Euthydemus is not a model student because he is not one of the "good natures" that Socrates was interested in. For Xenophon tells us at the outset of book four that when Socrates playfully said he was in love with someone, he was really interested not in young beauties but in good natures, intellectually gifted youths who desire the knowledge that would enable them to succeed in private and public life (Memorabilia 4.1.2). Euthydemus' conversational performance with Socrates is not impressive, but whatever we may think of Euthydemus' acumen, or his belief that his collection of books guaranteed that he had pursued philosophy in the best possible way, one must read against the grain of the text to claim that Euthydemus is not a good nature.

For Euthydemus, as Pangle recognizes, certainly became a "student-lover" of Socrates. And while Pangle argues that at 4.1.3 Xenophon shifts from discussing good natures to discussing three defective types, those who pride themselves on their birth, wealth, or education, and "will not pen a single additional word about 'the good natures' (including himself, and Plato)" (165), Pangle soon admits that the third defective type may well include good natures (167). Moreover, Socrates' discussion of what Pangle calls defective types rests on analogies with horses and dogs who have good natures but need proper education. Pangle argues, via a citation of the Oeconomicus (chapters 12-13), that analogies to the training of animals do not apply to the training of the best sort of human. But the Oeconomicus passage suggests only that humans, unlike animals, can be taught by persuasion, and Socrates obviously believes that those who pride themselves on birth, wealth, or prior education can be persuaded to learn more, as the analogy with animals is itself an example of how to persuade them.

Finally, in commenting on his translation of the final sentence of Socrates' initial conversation with Euthydemus (4.2.40, quoted above), Pangle posits one ambiguity in the sentence that no one, to my knowledge, has previously recognized, while implicitly resolving a possible ambiguity in favor of his interpretation. Socrates replaced his "disturbing" interrogations with "very simple and very clear" explanations of "the things he believed [Euthydemus] needed to know and that would be strongest to practice." (183)

In a footnote (258n25), Pangle wonders whether the subject of the verb "believed" (enomizen) could be Euthydemus, though he admits it is probably Socrates. The subject, while it is unexpressed in the Greek, must be Socrates, as Greek would need to express the subject to indicate a change in subject from Socrates to Euthydemus. What is slightly ambiguous is the subject of "needed," an infinitive in the Greek (dein); Pangle puts Euthydemus in brackets to show that he is supplying his name, and this is a possible rendering, but it is far more likely that the infinitive is generalizing, as it is several times elsewhere in this very chapter of the Memorabilia. Thus this sentence does not say that Socrates merely supplied what Euthydemus thought Euthydemus needed, but that Socrates explained what everyone needs. It remains a major problem for an esoteric reading.

Readers may be pardoned for finding this philological excursus a bit tedious, but I have engaged in it precisely because it is the sort of thing Pangle does not regularly do. He is no doubt aware that conventional readers consider Euthydemus to be a good nature, and he presents some arguments in favor of his own view. But he rarely admits that there is a possible reading other than his own, and thus never directly addresses arguments on the other side. Pangle's helpful scholarly apparatus does sometimes point one to where such views can be found, but readers who don't sample "conventional" scholarship themselves will be left in the dark.

To be fair, conventional scholars also generally fail to consider Straussian alternatives. This is one reason they will benefit from Pangle's book. They will find it frustrating, but will also encounter insights and productive provocations on every page. And I would think that readers already open to Strauss's approach will find it an absolute delight. Thus, despite the reservation expressed above, I believe this is a book that anyone interested in Xenophon's Socrates needs to read.

[1] For an effort to show that Xenophon’s interest in practical success distinguishes him from other Socratics see Gabriel Danzig, “Plato, Aristotle, and Xenophon on the Ends of Virtue,” 340-364 in Danzig et al., eds. Plato and Xenophon: Comparative Studies. Brill, 2018.