The Soul Hypothesis: Investigations into the Existence of the Soul

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Mark C. Baker and Stewart Goetz (eds.), The Soul Hypothesis: Investigations into the Existence of the Soul, Continuum, 2011; 279pp.; $19.95 (pbk), ISBN 9781441152244.

Reviewed by Howard Robinson, Central European University


Most books advocating dualism are defensive and modest in tone. They tend to admit that a scientific naturalism explains almost all reality, but plead that there are reasons for thinking it cannot cope with consciousness -- the 'hard problem'. This book is quite different. Its view is that humanity through the ages has recognised that there is plainly something special about the dynamic inner life of the mind -- humans have souls -- and that the reasons given nowadays for abandoning this belief are tendentious, both philosophically and scientifically. Folk psychology remains central to our status as human beings, no progress has been made in giving a physicalist account of consciousness and, most striking, progress in neurology leaves us little better off than were the ancient Greeks in moving from some elementary correlations between brain and mind to positively explaining our mental life in physical terms. What is more, modern physics rejects the conservation principles that were supposed to be the scientific problem for interactionism, and quantum theory requires irreducible consciousness to endow physical reality with any determinate features. This is dualism (or mentalism) on the front foot and it is gratifying to see.

There are nine chapters, plus an introduction, all well worth reading. There are also connecting passages by the editors between all chapters. This is a useful innovation. Failure to include an item on the contributors is, however, an unfortunate omission.

Chapter 1, 'The Soul of the Matter', by Charles Taliaferro lucidly presents the standard but powerful claim against materialism that it cannot accommodate consciousness: science is confined to the third-person viewpoint and all attempts to provide a third-personal account of the first-person conscious perspective fail.

In chapter 2, 'Minds, Brains, and Brains in Vats', Daniel Robinson presents a philosophical psychologist's critique of physicalist pretensions. He points out that doctors have known about the existence of brain and mind correlations, as revealed by brain damage cases, ever since the ancient Greeks. The fact that we now know of such correlations in significantly more detail does not of itself constitute a philosophical breakthrough in our understanding of the relation between mind and brain. Everything done in the science of this area is in the service of understanding how our Folk Psychological states operate, not in replacing them. And the use made of scientific data to prove that human character and agency are mere products of physical processes often involves tendentious interpretations of that data. A classic case of this is how much is made of the case of Phineas Gage, where much speculation about the location of character and agency is based on few hard facts about Gage's injuries and behavioural changes.

Robinson's chapter leads naturally on to Mark Baker's 'Brains and Souls; Grammar and Speaking'. Fifty years ago, Chomsky divided language into three components: the lexicon, grammar and what he called 'the Creative Aspect of Language Use' (CALU). Baker's central point is that Chomsky thought then that we could investigate grammar but not CALU scientifically, and the situation is no different now. Baker argues that the linguistic deficits associated with brain damage all relate to lexical and grammatical problems, none directly to the ability to think creatively which, by implication, somehow transcends the brain.

The same agency-centred theme emerges in Stewart Goetz's chapter 4, 'Making Things Happen: Souls in Action'. Goetz argues that common sense sees us as agents but that causal closure, as accepted by most physicalists, undermines this. He quotes Richard Taylor and Jaegwon Kim, who argue that science challenges our picture of ourselves as agents. Goetz counters 'that there is good reason to think that the argument from causal closure is unsound'. (104) The belief in it results from generalizing the methodological principle that when carrying out neurological experiments one must exclude other causal influences than physical stimuli on the brain to the conclusion that there are no other influences during normal circumstances. He quotes Wilder Penfield's evidence that whenever he prompted some conscious state or action in a subject by directly stimulating the brain, the subject always thought of it as something done to him -- he never identified it as a decision he had been prompted to make.

The Goetz chapter raises an important point about the development of physicalism. At least one motive behind twentieth-century physicalism was the desire to avoid epiphenomenalism: if the mind is the brain then mind and body can interact without challenging the autonomy of the physical. But if the world is closed under physics, all the real work is done at the most micro level, and the entities of the special sciences can seem to be as epiphenomenal as an immaterial mind. Perhaps the situation is worse for psychology than the other special sciences, because its explanatory mode is different from all the physical sciences. Whereas the physical sciences concern causes, psychology involves reasons, desires, beliefs, etc., and their replacement by a dynamic that consists of subatomic fields seems more undermining of them than it is for macro physical causes if they are so replaced. (In these latter cases, it is, as it were, just smaller versions of the same sort of thing.) This latter point is taken up again by William Hasker in chapter 8 (205f). If this line of thought is correct, then physicalism loses what was thought to be one of its major virtues, namely saving the efficacy of the mental. This failure might be said to constitute the second crisis of physicalism, following on its failure to accommodate consciousness. Perhaps there ought to have been a more concentrated discussion in the volume of whether physicalism is committed to denying efficacy to all levels except a foundational one. Jonathan Schaffer (2003), for example, denies that this is the situation.

The next chapter is Robin Collins's first of two contributions to the volume, 'The Energy of the Soul'. He cites Dennett, Flanagan and Fodor as examples of the typical view that dualist interactionism contravenes basic conservation principles and so is radically anti-scientific. I must admit that I had always thought this a serious problem. Collins shows quite clearly that, according to modern science, energy is not conserved in general relativity, in quantum theory, or in the universe taken as a whole. The standard knock-down objection to interactionism, therefore, rests, it seems, not on science, but on an ignorance of the development of science since the mechanistic theories of the nineteenth century.

Chapter 6 is Hans Halvorson's 'The Measure of All Things: Quantum Mechanics and the Soul'. Like most philosophers who lack a degree in physics, I am very hesitant to pass any comments on the interpretation of quantum theory (and am very grateful to Barry Loewer for attempting to explain some things to me). Halvorson sets up the measurement problem, which, I think, is as follows. Quantum theory's strange conclusions are founded on data obtained by measuring effects in certain experimental situations. But if quantum theory is correct there are no determinate data of the required sort, for the states of the measuring instruments will be superposed and entangled and thus indeterminate. The dualist has a way out of this problem. Superposition is when a physical system is in two apparently inconsistent states at once -- for example, an electron is passing through both the left-hand slit and the right-hand one at the same time. Because of the nature of linear dynamics, this superposition is retained in a device further down the line of this process. If this continued with an observer, he would be aware of inconsistently believing that the electron was in two places at once. But this is not what happens. Observation 'collapses the wave packet' (not a phrase Halvorson generally deploys) and only one determinate state is observed. Now it is often pointed out that measurement collapses the wave packet, but that the measuring device need not be a conscious observer. Halvorson, if I understand him, replies to this that a non-conscious measuring device will itself be in an entangled state, but that if a conscious subject observes it, only one of its possible states will be seen, so consciousness is crucial to making reality determinate. (151)

Dean Zimmerman in chapter 7, 'From Experience to Experiencer', argues that a dual aspect physicalism cannot work. His reason is based on what is often called the 'many Fs problem'. All macro physical objects have vague boundaries. This leads some philosophers to say that there are as many objects present as there are ways of precisifying the boundaries. So if the boundaries of my brain are vague, there are many brains in my head (or in my many heads). If my mental states are properties of my brain (as the dual aspect physicalist is liable to claim), which brain do they belong to – or does each brain have a mental life?" To avoid this unacceptable situation, mental states must be attributed to something other than a macroscopic physical object, namely a mental substance or soul, which Zimmerman believes is an emergent, rather than infused, entity.

I agree that the vagueness of complex physical objects poses problems, but I do not think that multiplying massively overlapping entities is the solution to these problems. As I have argued elsewhere (Robinson 2008), I think that vagueness is a reason for not taking a strongly realist (as opposed to a conceptualist) approach to macroscopic physical objects. This does not, however, directly force one to accept substance dualism and a soul. A cloud of physical simples that we pick out as a brain could be the causal basis for a bundle of mental states of a kind that Hume -- or, more recently, Barry Dainton (2008) -- defend. These might be totally dependent on the cloud of physical simples that we call a brain and this would not be very different from a dual aspect theory. I am not satisfied with such a bundle dualism, but I do not think that macro vagueness of the physical forces one directly to substance dualism.

Hasker, in chapter 8, 'Souls Beastly and Human' also defends emergent substance dualism. He starts by describing the way in which the discovery in the mid-eighteenth century that a certain small polyp was an animal, not a plant, yet could be divided and both parts survive alive, led La Mettrie and others to conclude that there was no soul, for souls could not be divided. Hasker argues that this was the wrong path to have taken, for physicalism makes the mental epiphenomenal, including in the evolutionary process where cognition is supposed to play a vital role. He agrees, however, that the polyp, with the degree of integration between soul and body that it illustrates, does cause problems for Cartesian dualism, but thinks that emergent substance dualism can have the best of both worlds.

Zimmerman, Hasker and -- elsewhere -- Swinburne (1997) all defend emergent substance dualism. I have the following worry about this theory. The power to produce conscious states appears to be entirely discontinuous from all the other powers of matter. Assuming theism is true and that God sustains all things, I'm not clear what is the difference between saying that matter has this 'nomologically dangling' power and that God makes sure that a soul is present when needed. The point is that this power is not a feature of matter qua matter, but is tagged on extraneously. (Of course, neutral monism makes it an expression of the nature of matter, but then that is not a form of emergence.)

In the Afterword the editors speculate about why the natural 'soul hypothesis' has so much fallen out of fashion. They think that the scientific Zeitgeist is one explanation, but that the association of the soul with religion is even more important. They omit, in my opinion, a very important third factor, namely the difficulty of giving an account of interaction between mind and body which seems intuitively natural and not contrived. On the one hand, the data seem blatantly dualistic; on the other, a natural account of their interface seems permanently to evade us. This is not primarily a matter of the difficulty in coming up with an empirically supported version of interaction, but of even imagining one that does not seem a sort of deus ex machina. This explains, at least in part, the appeal, at the time, of Ryle's polemic against dualism for being a 'category mistake'.

This gives special interest to Collins's second contribution, chapter 9, 'A Scientific Case for the Soul', which aims to give a novel account of interaction. Collins's argument is as follows. If we think of qualia as generated directly by the brain, the laws characterizing these connections will be very complex, because many neurological variables will be involved. When, in other scientific cases, linking laws are complex in this way, simplification is achieved by postulating an underlying mechanism which unifies the apparently arbitrary collection of variables. Collins cites as an instance of this the way in which postulating electrons and electromagnetic waves gives a simple explanation of how radios work, whereas correlating inputs and outputs of a more macro sort would be very complex. Collins's own solution is to postulate a soul that has a physical and non-subjective aspect as well as an immaterial and subjective one. It is the former of these that picks up the complex input from the brain and simplifies these down by resonating to them like a wire with a limited number of harmonics. This simplified pattern can then be transformed or mapped on to qualia.

I am not confident that I have this right, nor am I sure what to make of it as a positive suggestion. I am not confident that the complexity argument against neural causes of qualia is sound. Collins himself suggests the following reply:

The proposal is that conscious awareness occurs when there are resonant vibrations between the thalamic and cortical structures of the brain that are in the frequency range of 20 to 50 hertz. Based on [this] proposal, one could postulate a linking law according to which consciousness comes into existence if and only if the amplitude of such resonance vibrations is above a certain threshold. (232)

Collins's reply to this is that this is not really a simple law unless there is an exact definition of what counts as the thalamic and what as the cortical structures, and this leads back to complexity and multiplicity of the sort Zimmerman finds in the concept of the brain. But 'thalamus' and 'cortex' are scientific terms and as they presumably function in neurological explanations in other cases without having to be exactly precisified, I do not see why it is ruled out in this case. Nor does Collins explain how the physical and non-physical aspects of the soul can be bound into one entity. So I am not convinced that he has given us a natural-seeming account of the relation of body and soul. Nor am I sure that he has not.

I have two final more general remarks. First, I think that the failure to consider bundle dualism in this volume is a philosophical omission. Simply to assume that mental states must belong to something and if they do not belong to a physical substance they must belong to a mental one is too quick, given the state of the philosophical debate.

Second, I think that this is a book that all philosophers of mind, from senior undergraduates up, should read. Some of the material in the scientific pieces came as revelations to me and help undermine the current presumption that scientific naturalism is the educated option -- even physical science does not really support it. Philosophical naturalism is, indeed, a naked emperor.


Dainton, B. (2008): The Phenomenal Self, Clarendon Press, Oxford.

Robinson, H. (2008): 'Vagueness, Realism, Language and Thought', in Proceedings of the Aristotelian Society, vol.CIX, 83-101.

Schaffer, J. (2003): 'Is there a fundamental level?', Nous, 37:3, 498-517.

Swinburne, R. (1997): The Evolution of the Soul, Clarendon Press, Oxford.