The Soul of Justice: Social Bonds and Racial Hubris

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Willett, Cynthia, The Soul of Justice: Social Bonds and Racial Hubris, Cornell University Press, 2001, 241 pp, $17.95 (pbk), ISBN 0-801-48715-3.

Reviewed by Linda A. Bell, Georgia State University


The Soul of Justice: Social Bonds and Racial Hubris is well-written and important. Cynthia Willett begins by telling the reader exactly what she plans to do in the book, contrasting the dedication of liberal theorists to the inviolability of the individual with the fact that large numbers of individuals are required to serve as poorly paid laborers in order to maintain the “[h]igh standards of living among the middle and upper classes” in modern liberal states. Going to the heart of her problem, she then asks: “Does the contradiction between the liberal principle of the individual and the reality of the massive degradation reflect the inability to put our liberal ideas into practice? Or is there something amiss in the principle itself?” (p. 1).

Willett spends the remainder of the book supporting her hypothesis that the problem does lie in the principle itself, particularly in its focus on autonomy and its minimalization of the fact of interdependency. While she thinks that “liberal theory is absolutely right to raise the individual to the ultimate principle of justice,” what is problematic is the way it conceives of the individual, overemphasizing the role of reason in individual lives and the capacity to make choices while undervaluing “the need to cultivate diverse relationships based on friendship, emotional intimacy, and economic cooperation in a thriving social milieu” (pp. 2-3).

What she tries to do is “shift … the center of identity away from monotonous discourses of ownership and merit toward the diverse discourses of the lover, the working family, and the cosmopolitan friend.” Though “Anglo-American and Habermasian philosophers have tempered the excessive individualism and rationalism of Enlightenment liberalism by drawing upon … an ethics of care,” and post-Hegelian philosophers have “unmask[ed] the postures of rationalism through the legacy of Freud,” neither tradition goes far enough since “neither … challenges autonomy as the ultimate meaning of individuality” (p. 4) This leads Willett to turn, as she did in her earlier book, to African-American thinkers. In the writings of Frederick Douglass, Toni Morrison, and Patricia Hill Collins, she finds a conception of the individual that “integrates the rational capacity into a whole person, who is first of all defined in terms of the social capacity to flourish with others in history, culture, and a work-based community” without focusing the accounts of human relationships either on “quasi-biological needs for nurturing and trust” (as do those in the Anglo-American tradition) or on “quasi-biological drives for erotic satisfaction as neo-Romantic, continental thinkers tend to do” (p. 4). This alternative understanding allows, Willett argues, for an articulation of the “social pathos of arrogance” in a way that an Enlightenment model of human rights does not, which in turn opens the way to a recognition of the crime of arrogance, hubris, and to her reinterpretation of this from the limitations of ancient Greek democracy to a modern and egalitarian democratic view (p. 5).

Many have argued, as Willett does in Part I, against the excessive individualism and emphasis on rationality of the Anglo-American tradition, even after it has been supplemented with the ethics of care. Others have faulted the romantic emphasis on eros in continental thinkers. Willett does this in Part II. Perhaps in neither case, though, have the arguments been developed as well and as thoroughly as those she presents. Few have tried to examine these traditions together, and fewer still have proposed a common defect in them such as Willett suggests when she convincingly accuses them of each relying in different ways on the quasi-biological. Even fewer have turned, as she does in Part III, to African-Americans like Frederick Douglass and Toni Morrison for a more adequate view of the individual and thereby a better basis for ethics and a doctrine of rights. This, I think, is what makes the book so important and why I shall concentrate on this third section of her book.

In her effort to construct a more adequate view of the individual, Willett attempts a number of things. She seeks a more defensible view of the child than the narcissistic one that she continually uncovers in the thinkers she examines and whose views she rejects. She tries to find a less passive, less biological view of the mother/child relationship, one that avoids the fusion presumed by so many. And she wants a theory of maturation that rejects the traditional story of alienation as the child supposedly develops autonomy by moving from the “natural” realm of the mother/family into the social, public world of the father. Mainly, she looks for and finds a view of the child’s embeddedness in relationships that will serve as a grounding for later connectedness with others in relationships of love, friendship, and moral concern for strangers.

She finds this recognition of embeddedness in certain African-American thinkers. In Frederick Douglass’s writing, there is the acknowledgment that being raised by his grandmother gave him a sense of spirit and of home as he moved out to the realm of the public, first that of his masters and then that of the Northern abolitionists. As she notes, he reports that while he was under the care of his black grandmother, “he felt himself to be a ‘man,’” only later, when he left his family, becoming “what the white master would call a boy” (p. 197), quite the reverse of what the traditional myth of maturation would lead us to expect. It is a sense of “practical recognition,” the sort of recognition “that one might expect to enjoy in a place one called ‘home’,” that Douglass longs for and demands when he finds himself telling his enslavement story to the white abolitionists of the North (p. 194).

In Toni Morrison’s Beloved, Willett sees something similar as Denver matures by reaching out to the community. What is important in these accounts for Willett is that both reachings out are in response to something like Aristotle’s hubris, a crime of arrogance recognized in a more limited way by ancient Greeks, a crime liberal theory cannot acknowledge. Such actions violate “codes of honor and hospitality among friends and strangers.” Their horror, according to Willett, “is the abusive pleasure that the powerful enjoy in asserting their superior status over those of lesser status” (p. 183). Acts of hubris can involve the most powerful in the society, as do the crimes of slavery and rape; or they may involve considerably lesser degrees of power, as do the wrongful pride of Sethe (p. 222) and Paul D’s repetition of the arrogance of the white man when he reprimands Sethe for murdering her child before it could be taken by the slave catchers: “You got two feet, Sethe, not four” (cited, p. 224).

In Morrison’s novel, Willett sees hubris expanded significantly so as to reject slavery and the subordination of women, both of which the ancient Greeks accepted. With the Greeks, though, she agrees that crimes of arrogance “tear at the social fabric of our existence” (p. 184). The significance of hubris is missed by liberal theory where there is so little recognition either of hubris or of its capacity for destruction. Even Paul D, far readier to embrace a recognition of hubris, focuses on the beating Sethe received from the schoolteacher and the nephews but has difficulty grasping the significance of their violating her breasts by taking her milk (p. 218).

With a different understanding of the individual, Willett is able to develop a more socially-embedded concept of freedom (“the right to form the bonds that make us human” [p. 225]) and, even more important, with the notion of hubris, a social concept of justice to oppose the liberal one of justice as protection of individual autonomy from external constraints. On the basis of her new view of justice, she proposes what she calls the social humanist concept of rights: the protection of the individual “from violations of his or her meaningful relationships” (p. 210). With this, she enables us to grasp the violation and the horror of rape and slavery in a way that liberal theory cannot.

In addition, she is able to endorse and explain the liberatory power of love, with the “friendly gaze” bathing the other in its light, “the transformative power of the imagination.” Paul D transforms “’the revolting clump of scars’” the beating left on Sethe’s back into “’the decorative work of an ironsmith too passionate for display’” much as did the white servant girl Amy Denver earlier when she saved Sethe and her child and saw “in the same scars ‘tiny little cherry blossoms’” (pp. 220-221). Later when Sethe asks Paul D if he has come back to count her feet and ruefully pronounces that Beloved was her “best thing,” his response reveals once again the friendly gaze and its healing powers over hubris: “You your best thing, Sethe” (cited, pp. 224-25).

“Hubris and its repair,” as Willett says, “are at the center of Morrison’s novel” (p.213). The same can be said for Willett’s book. As she says:

The crime of hubris undermines the basis for a human relationship between the perpetrator and the victim. The perpetrator both knows and denies the humanity of the person whom he attacks. He represents the other person as part subhuman—but also as part human. In ancient Greece, crimes of hubris were expected to lead to uncontrollable outrage and acts of revenge. These crimes would destroy households and cities. Before laying a hand on the slaves, the schoolteacher commits the crime that releases the ancient terror. He dares to represent Sethe as less than a human being. The crime creates secret pleasure and self-righteous power, but it also brings the fear of social unrest and tragic revenge. This is the jungle that the white man creates. This jungle is America. (p. 222)

This is not to say that a book will or can repair the hubris to which she refers, but surely a first step is to formulate an adequate analysis of what is wrong and why. If Willett is right, as I think she is, the dominant traditions in the West operate under a view of self, freedom, and justice that prevent an understanding of the crime of arrogance and that thereby preclude anything like an adequate grasp of slavery and rape as well as of many of the new forms of injustice perpetrated by more modern forms of power.