The Soul of Nietzsche's Beyond Good and Evil

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Maudemarie Clark and David Dudrick, The Soul of Nietzsche's Beyond Good and Evil, Cambridge University Press, 2012, 282pp., $29.99 (pbk), ISBN 9780521793803.

Reviewed by Mattia Riccardi, Universidade do Porto


Beyond Good and Evil (1886) (BGE) arguably occupies a privileged position in the economy of Nietzsche's works. Certainly, it is the best place to look if one is interested in his views on thosetopics which traditionally come under the heading of "first philosophy". The book is also intimately connected to other important pieces Nietzsche wrote in this period, like On the Genealogy of Morality (1887) and the fifth book of The Gay Science (1887). Moreover, BGE is supposed to provide an "introduction to the background of Zarathustra", as Nietzsche wrote to his editor.[1] It is, at the same time, an extraordinarily intricate piece of philosophical writing. Clark and Dudrick take on the ambitious task of offering a textually careful as well as philosophically sensitive reading of the book. The result is a powerfully argued and challenging investigation, which shows how sophisticated Nietzsche's treatment of the traditional questions about the True and the Good is. Their focus is on Part 1 of BGE, for there Nietzsche lays the theoretical ground for his subsequent treatment of ethics.

The authors claim that BGE can be read either exoterically or esoterically. Prima facie, the book seems to articulate a completely naturalistic project. This, however, they claim, is just how it looks exoterically. Nietzsche's way of writing, they suggest, aims at urging the (attentive) reader to overcome this allegedly superficial impression and access the deeper, esoteric meaning of his book. This would be true, in particular, of the physiological and biological talk he often adopts. To take this talk at face value would be to remain blind to the esoteric meaning Nietzsche is actually trying to convey to the (careful) reader. Once this blindness is removed, she would realize that "he does not turn his back on the normative aspirations of traditional philosophy" (9).

The strategy by which Clark and Dudrick substantiate this general approach is carried out in two main steps. In the first part of the book, they argue that Nietzsche doesn't aim at resolving the tension between the "will to truth" (as best represented by scientific knowledge) and the "will to value" (our normative commitments) in favor of one of these two poles. Rather, he envisages a "philosophy of the future" according to which both wills or drives can productively cohabit. The second part focuses on Nietzsche's philosophical psychology, which the authors interpret as a renewal of Plato's view of the soul. I shall summarize how they proceed in articulating these two main points and then raise some worries about their reading.

Clark and Dudrick start by spelling out a metaphor which appears in BGE's "Preface". There, Nietzsche refers to the "magnificent tension of the spirit" [2] resulting from the millenarian "struggle against Plato" and "Christianity" (BGE, Preface). According to their proposal, this "magnificent tension" is the one between the "will to truth" and "will to value". Accordingly, the aphorisms ofBGE One should be read as telling a story about the role of and mutual relation between these two conflicting drives. As the authors read this story, it is wrong to take Nietzsche as criticizing either the "will to truth" -- the mistake of postmodern readings -- or, alternatively, the "will to value" -- the mistake of naturalist readings.[3]

On the one hand, Nietzsche's talk of "fictions of logic" (BGE 4) and of physics as "only an interpretation" and "not an explanation of the world" (BGE 14) may induce the reader into the first kind of mistake and into falsely believing that he simply denies that science and even knowledge in general are possible. However, Clark and Dudrick maintain, this is just the exoteric surface of Nietzsche's text. In fact, he praises the "will to truth" embodied by scientific knowledge. This clearly emerges from his endorsement of (a version of) sensualism according to which the senses are the only sources of knowledge (BGE 15), an epistemological position which smoothly combines with Nietzsche's rejection of dogmatism understood as the view that "truth can be won by a priori means" (17).[4]

On the other hand, though his commitment to sensualism shows that "Nietzsche is a naturalist in an important sense" (9), it would be wrong to conclude that he is a thorough naturalist. One might well be (incorrectly) led to this conclusion by his claim that philosophy doesn't have "a 'drive for knowledge'" as its "father" (BGE 6), but rather corresponds to a mere projection of the philosopher's own values. However, the authors deny that Nietzsche is thereby suggesting that philosophers should renounce their normative commitments. Quite the contrary, being able to "see" things in terms of values is what constitutes, in his eyes, the very essence of philosophy. A key passage for Clark's and Dudrick's reading is GS 373, where Nietzsche writes that "a 'scientific' interpretation of the world might still be one of the stupidest", for "an essentially mechanistic world would be an essentially meaningless world". To better illustrate his point, Nietzsche uses the example of music:

Suppose one judged the value of a piece of music according to how much of it could be counted, calculated, and expressed in formulas -- how absurd such a 'scientific' evaluation of music would be! What would one have comprehended, understood, recognized! Nothing, really nothing of what is 'music' in it! (GS 373)

For Clark and Dudrick, Nietzsche is here drawing the limits of science's explanatory power:

Scientific explanations at their best are true, but they lose their truth when accompanied by an insistence that everything can be explained scientifically.  . . .  The only things that stand outside the range of scientific explanation  . . .  are human beings and their various forms of expression, including thought and behavior."(131)

As they put it elsewhere, Nietzsche clearly separates the "space of causes" -- the realm of scientific explanation -- from the "space of reasons" -- the realm of rational justification (124). Values such as the beauty of a piece of music are located in the latter. Hence, Clark and Dudrick claim, Nietzsche doesn't aim at naturalizing Kant's program, but rather at carrying on his "normative project" (75). In this way, Nietzsche becomes a precursor of Wilfrid Sellars and of John McDowell (the former is explicitly mentioned, p. 124).

The second part of the book is devoted to Nietzsche's philosophical psychology. The authors oppose the widespread thesis that he simply dismisses normatively loaded notions like 'soul' and 'will'. They first address Nietzsche's treatment of the soul and argue that he only criticizes the "atomistic" conception which takes it to be "something indestructible, eternal, indivisible" (BGE 12). Contrary to this view, Nietzsche proposes to think of "'the soul as a society constructed out of drives and affects'" (BGE 12). In so doing, Clark and Dudrick suggest, he revives Plato's view of the soul as composite. In Nietzsche's modified picture, however, the multiple elements which form the soul and whose mutual interrelations determine one's behavior are simply our drives. In turn, the order of one's drives is what constitutes one's will. Importantly, this would lend the will enough causal power to disprove epiphenomenalist readings of Nietzsche's position.

The key point of the authors' reading is that "the drives are arranged not merely in a causal order but in a political one" (175). This would emerge from Nietzsche's description -- in BGE 19, of which they provide an impressive reading (at pp. 176-85) -- of the drives as standing in rank relations of command and obedience to one another. The order of the drives which constitutes someone's will is thus the "normative order" also constituting her "values" (195). Having such a will is what makes us persons able to act on reasons. As such, we enter the "space of reasons" to which scientific explanations are blind.

Provided this framework, Clark and Dudrick go on to address two last questions. The first concerns Nietzsche's notion of will to power, which they read psychologically as a kind of "second-order drive" (220) shared by all other drives and underlying the process through which these end up forming the political order which constitutes one's will. Furthermore, they argue that Nietzsche's notion of will to power has no role to play outside his philosophical psychology. To substantiate this claim, they offer an esoteric reading of those aphorisms where it is apparently employed in a biological (BGE 13), physical (BGE 22) or ontological (BGE 36) sense. In addition, the authors maintain that the view of the soul they ascribe to Nietzsche has the advantage of providing an illuminating rationale for his peculiar way of writing. They propose to see his style not as a departure from argumentative rigor, but rather as the attempt to revitalize Socrates' and Plato's agonic and erotic understanding of dialectic. However, given that Nietzsche doesn't consider reason to be an autonomous part of the soul, as Plato did, but rather as resulting from the (normative) order of the drives, a philosophical piece of writing is effective, to his eyes, only if it is able to "affect the drives" (259). And this is precisely what Nietzsche tries to achieve in writing the way he does.

Though Clark and Dudrick's case in favor of a normative reading of BGE is supported by a meticulous and often penetrating interpretation of Nietzsche's book, I think it faces some substantial difficulties. I shall focus on two main points.

The first concerns their appeal to the distinction, found in BGE, between exoteric and esoteric. As Nietzsche explicitly endorses it, it seems obvious that his book has been written in view of it (see, e.g., p. 8). However, by praising this distinction he doesn't seem to suggest that a text should have both an overt and a covert meaning, as Clark and Dudrick suppose. His point is rather that, since the kind of reaction one has to certain views depends on one's being a "higher" or a "lesser" type of man (BGE 30), in many cultures such views were allowed -- rightly, for Nietzsche -- to circulate only within limited circles of initiates. The same point is made with regard to books, some of which "have inverse values for soul and for health, depending on whether they are used by the lower souls  . . .  or by the higher  . . .  ones" (BGE 30).

Nonetheless, the authors are right in stressing that Nietzsche's texts are written so as to misguide hasty readers and that his usage of certain terms differs from the current one. Thus, even if the exoteric-esoteric distinction is of little help in illuminating such peculiarities, their exegetical efforts are more than justified. In some cases, such efforts also strike me as successful, as when they propose to read Nietzsche's claim that logical principles are "false" as tantamount to "not-transcending our cognitive practices".[5] In my view, however, what makes the authors' approach successful in this case is that "falsity" is a term which -- together with "belief", "truth", "knowledge", "consciousness", "will", "freedom of the will", etc. -- belongs to philosophy's traditional vocabulary. Such terms often appear double-quoted in Nietzsche's texts,[6] a stylistic device he employs to advise the (attentive) reader to bracket out their standard meaning. This doesn't , though, usually happen when he adopts the physiological or biological talk that is the main target of the authors' esoteric reading. Thus, it seems to me more natural to hold that, in referring to his "foreign"-sounding "new language" (BGE 3), Nietzsche wants to make us reflect on his usage of the traditional philosophical jargon.

More serious difficulties, I think, concern the core of Clark and Dudrick's interpretation. In particular, there are reasons to doubt that the normative aspects they find in BGE suffice to ground the attribution to Nietzsche of substantial concerns with rational justification. Consider for instance their view of Nietzsche as carrying on Kant's normative program. Nietzsche characterizes the "space of reasons" which Kant separates from the "space of causes" of empirical knowledge as a less attractive "logical 'Beyond'" (D, Preface 3). Given thatit seems hard to see both philosophers as here embarking on the same project.[7] At least, it indicates that Nietzsche doesn't draw the same kind of distinction Kant draws. Nor do the authors tell us in which sense the "space of reasons" envisaged by Nietzsche might differ from Kant's "logical 'Beyond'".

Similar problems emerge if we turn to Clark and Dudrick's account of Nietzsche's theory of the soul. According to it, the "political" order of the drives constituting the soul cannot just correspond to their "causal" order, for it is not merely "an order of strength" (189). Now, it is right to stress that the will to power underlying the formation of such a political order is not equivalent to brute strength. This is reflected by Nietzsche's using the German term Macht, which is germane to the political sphere, rather than Kraft. However, this doesn't show that the power relations between the drives cannot be captured in causal terms. For one thing, it certainly seems wrong to assume that brute strength is the only option available here. It is possible to conceive such relations as realized by sophisticated psychological mechanisms and still treat them as causal. If this is so, why not think of the "political" order as constituted by, or resulting from, the way in which the drives (causally) interact? Moreover, it is not clear in which sense the power relations between the drives might be captured in terms of reasons, as the authors claim. They argue that Nietzsche's command-obedience talk implies that the lower-ranked drives "recognize the authority" of the higher-ranked drives (193). But how are we to make sense of it? Clark and Dudrick compare the order of the drives to the "'dominance hierarchies'" which structure the social life of primates (199). This might be an insightful way of seeing it, but it doesn't help us to see how the transactions between the drives happen within something that might be called a "space of reasons". Rather, it seems to suggest that they don't.

Let us move from the sub-personal level of the drives to the personal level of the agent (a distinction the authors themselves utilize). Perhaps what motivates talking in terms of rational justification is the way the agent is committed to her values. Clark and Dudrick claim that one's values are constituted by the normative order of one's drives. Each drive highlights a certain aspect of reality as something valuable. If a drive occupies a high-ranked position in the agent's internal normative economy, she will normally assume the drive's "viewpoint" and take to be valuable whatever it highlights as such. Thus, if the agent's value-commitments are constituted by the value-commitments of her highest-ranked drives, it is hard to see how the former ones might be rationally justified independently from the latter ones. (This, indeed, sits nicely with Nietzsche's insistence that the actual motives of our actions lie at the level of our drives.) As we have seen, however, the (sub-personal) transactions between our drives don't seem to leave room for something like a "space of reasons".

There is less doubt that Clark and Dudrick's book will be agenda-setting. Though one might doubt that their case in favor of a normative reading of BGE is successful, it surely provides the most sophisticated and powerful arguments so far brought against the naturalist one. It is also a major example of philosophical exegesis. The accurate, often even commentary-like, interpretation they offer of Nietzsche's aphorisms is always refreshingly insightful and philosophically stimulating. It is the kind of thorough, passionate and fascinating investigation one could only wish to come across more often, especially in the field of Nietzsche studies.[8]


(I use the standard abbreviations for Nietzsche's works)

Clark M. (1990): Nietzsche on Truth and Philosophy. Cambridge: Cambridge University Press.

Hussain N. (2004): 'Nietzsche's Positivism', European Journal of Philosophy 12/3: 326 -- 368.

Leiter B. (2002): Nietzsche on Morality, London: Routledge.

Nietzsche (1878-1880): Human, All Too Human, trans. by R.J. Hollingdale, with an Introduction by R. Schacht, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997. (=HUH)

Nietzsche F. (1881): Daybreak. Thoughts on the Prejudices of Morality, ed. by M. Clark and B. Leiter, trans. by R. J. Hollingdale, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 1997. (=D)

Nietzsche F. (1882/1887): The Gay Science, ed. by B. Williams, trans. by J. Nauckhoff and A. Del Caro, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2001. (=GS)

Nietzsche F. (1886): Beyond Good and Evil. Prelude to a Philosophy of the Future, ed. by R.P. Horstmann and J. Norman, trans. by J. Norman, Cambridge: Cambridge University Press, 2002. (=BGE)

Nietzsche F. (1980): Sämtliche Werke. Kritische Studienausgabe in 15 Bände, ed. by G. Colli and M. Montinari. Berlin, New York: De Gruyter. (=KSA)

Nietzsche F. (1986): Sämtliche Briefe. Kritische Studienausgabe in 8 Bände, ed. by G. Colli and M. Montinari. Berlin, New York: De Gruyter. (=KSB)

[1] To E.W. Fritzsch, 7th August 1886, KSB 7, 224.

[2] I adopt here the same translation as Clark and Dudrick.

[3] The main target here is Leiter (2002).

[4] This line of reading is not new for those familiar with Clark's previous (1990) book on Nietzsche. Here, however, it is refined and defended against Hussain (2004), who offers aphenomenalist interpretation of Nietzsche's sensualism.

[5] This is my rephrasing of Clark and Dudrick's interpretation (see pp. 48-63, in particular p. 57) of Nietzsche's claim that logical principles are among our "falsest judgments" (BGE 4).

[6] In fact, all the terms just listed appear double-quoted in BGE 2, 3 or 19. "Falsity" does not occur double-quoted in BGE 4, but appears immediately before Nietzsche's explicit reference to "new language", to which I shall come back to shortly.

[7] It is worth stressing that the "Preface" to Daybreak was also written in 1886. More important is that Kant's move of setting limits to empirical knowledge in order to leave room for a normative (moral) realm is consistently rejected by the middle and late Nietzsche. Relevant passages are: HUH II, Assorted Opinions and Maximes 27; D 197; KSA 12, 9[178], 442-43.

[8] Many thanks to Brian Leiter for his helpful comments on a previous draft.