The Sources of Husserl's "Ideas I"

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Andrea Staiti and Evan Clarke (eds.), The Sources of Husserl's "Ideas I", De Gruyter, 2018, 475pp., $126.99 (hbk), ISBN 9783110527803.

Reviewed by Chad Kidd, City College of New York


Even though Husserl's Ideas I (1913) is not as familiar to Anglophone philosophers today as, say, his Cartesian Meditations or Logical Investigations (1900-01), the Ideas nevertheless has had the greatest influence on how philosophers today typically understand Husserl's signature contributions to philosophy. These contributions include the epoché, the phenomenological reduction, Husserl's particular version of transcendental idealism, the transcendental ego (which he "discovered" during this phase of his career), the absolute being of consciousness, the ontological concept of eidos or "essence" and its applications in philosophical research. This is because many of these doctrines received their first presentation to the public in the Ideas, and so many of the most influential critiques of these doctrines -- by philosophers such as Roman Ingarden, Martin Heidegger, and Jean-Paul Sartre -- were based on careful readings of this text. As a result, Ideas I is a truly monumental part of Husserl's corpus and the development of phenomenological philosophy after him.

But it is surprising that, despite this, the Ideas has not received the kind of focused scholarly attention in Anglophone scholarship as befits it -- unlike how Anglophone scholarship has treated the monumental works of other philosophers, e.g., Kant's Critique, Hume's Treatise, and Spinoza's Ethics. Perhaps this is because the Ideas is often thought of today as a first attempt at a general introduction to phenomenology with which Husserl was apparently dissatisfied, since he went on to publish other attempts. But, one of the purposes of Andrea Staiti and Evan Clarke's book is to help today's historians of philosophy see more clearly that this is certainly not how either Husserl himself or Husserl's contemporaries read this text. Rather, what they saw in the Ideas was a forceful proposal for a radically new way of doing philosophy. And what ensued was a focused debate about this text and its proposals. The book makes some key texts in this debate available for the first time in English translation, with the hope that this will help fuel the recent re-awakening of scholarly interest in the Ideas among Anglophone historians.[1]

The book contains two kinds of texts: texts from Husserl's contemporaries that he criticizes in Ideas I, and texts published after the publication of Ideas I that criticize the new philosophical program it presents. So, while this material is far from being a collection of "the sources" of key Husserlian doctrines and methods presented in the Ideas -- one might here think of texts by Descartes, Kant, Hume, Brentano and perhaps even the Academic and Pyrrhonian skeptics -- as its title might suggest, it is material that elucidates the development and even the presentation of the key doctrines of Husserl's philosophy leading up to and following Ideas I.

In my view, one thing the book demonstrates quite clearly is how difficult it would be to try to put together a collection of "sources" of Husserl's views in the Ideas, as understood in the first way. For it exhibits well Husserl's independence of mind in the development of key doctrines and methods of Ideas I. This is exhibited in the way that Husserl's critics as well as his sympathizers seem to misunderstand key parts of his view -- at least, from Husserl's perspective -- despite their careful analysis of the text. These misunderstandings are made clear in articles and letters from Edith Stein and Husserl included in the volume that respond to many of the elaborations and criticisms of them included in the book. Therefore, careful study of the selections promises opportunity for a clearer understanding of what Husserl thought to be common biases and interpretive mistakes among his contemporaries, and an opportunity not to repeat these mistakes in our own reading of Husserl. As a result, I think that this is a book that would be of interest not only to the scholar of Husserl, but also to the historian of early 20th-Century European philosophy more broadly.

It is worthwhile noting the editors' criteria for selecting texts (cf., pp. 7-8). First, each of these texts pertain to Ideas I, either as a source that Husserl criticizes therein or a text that focuses primarily on the Ideas. Second, they are texts that Husserl either actually read or, at least, could have read -- in any case, the editors think there is good reason to believe that he was at least aware of the publication of each of these texts. Third, only German texts are included. And for the texts in Part 2, they discuss the Ideas in a direct and sustained fashion. These criteria of selection rule out a number of otherwise well-known and important discussions of the Husserl's philosophy in and after the Ideas, such as Eugen Fink's (1933) (which deals with Husserl's philosophy in general), Heidegger's (1985) (which offers up a reading with the agenda of presenting his own, alternative philosophical system), Carl Stumpf's unpublished critical remarks on the Ideas, and Emmanuel Levinas's (1995) hugely influential presentation of Husserlian phenomenology to the French academic world. But they allow for the inclusion of a number of texts by philosophers who are now largely unknown, especially to Anglophone readers of Husserl, who were active and, in some cases, influential figures in German-speaking philosophy of the early 20th-Century.

Part 1 contains articles and selections from books published between 1905 and 1913 that Husserl explicitly criticizes in Ideas I. As such, it is a useful source-book for that small number of places in the Ideas where Husserl deigns to name and criticize his contemporaries.

The first is a selection from Theodor Elsenhans's Textbook of Psychology (1912). In it Elsenhans attempts to elucidate what psychology is, its methods and objects of study (pp. 16-20), and its place alongside the natural sciences, human sciences, and philosophy (pp. 22-29). It also includes the section of the textbook on "intellectual feelings," which Husserl (2014, §29, note 16) calls "psychological fictions without the slightest foundation in the phenomena" -- a claim which should be of interest to philosophers working at the nexus of phenomenology and psychology on emotions and the attitudes today.

Next is Henry J. Watt's 1905 literature review of new research in psychology of memory and association. Writing reviews of recent literature in a field was a fairly common practice in German academic philosophy, which served the dual purpose of enabling scholars to stay up to date with the cutting edge of the field without having to read it all themselves and providing a platform for younger scholars to circulate their own ideas. As such, much of Watt's article is not of immediate interest to the scholar of Husserl; but as the introduction to the selection by its translator, Will Britt, makes helpfully clear (pp. 35-38), Watt's review does drift towards themes that pertain to Watt's own research concerning the structure of the act of thinking as a task-oriented enterprise. (This is a case, one of many in the book, where the translator's introduction provides some very helpful information about the text that follows, both about its author and its content.) The part of this selection that is of immediate interest for students of the Ideas is the nuanced discussion that opens the article about the methodological significance and limits of "self-observation" or "introspection" in psychological research -- a section that Husserl took to be representative of the skeptical attitude pervading empirical psychology in his day, and that he criticized trenchantly in §79 of the Ideas.

After that is a welcome English translation of Stumpf's "Appearances and Psychic Functions," which presents a conception of psychology that draws on both third-personal empirical studies and first-person, phenomenological analyses. In it Stumpf argues for a view on which psychic "functions" are different from "appearances" insofar as the former are relations among appearances (p. 82) -- appearances being sensations, sensory impressions, memory images and other "appearances of the second order" (ibid.) -- but like appearances insofar as functions are also "immediately given," and so are possible objects of phenomenological description (p. 84). The rest of the article comprises phenomenological explorations of a few significant psychic functions. I say that his translation is welcome because it should be not only of interest to scholars of Husserl, seeking to gain a clearer understanding of Husserl's use of the term "function" in his designation of phenomenology as a science that solves "functional problems" in Ideas I §86, but also to contemporary philosophers of mind, seeking an historically influential paradigm of interdisciplinary phenomenological-psychological research.

Also printed in the first half of the book are articles from Jonas Cohn ("The Fundamental Questions of Psychology"), Theodore Ziehen (selections from Epistemology on the Basis of Psychophysical and Physical Grounds), and August Messer ("Husserl's Phenomenology in its Relation to Psychology"), all of which are said by Husserl to be good illustrations of

how little even thorough researchers manage to free themselves from the course of the dominant prejudices and, for all their sympathy for phenomenological endeavors, how little they manage to apprehend the distinctiveness of phenomenology as a 'doctrine of essences'. (Ideas §79, footnote 19)

In other words, these are good examples of how not to read Husserl's phenomenology.

Of these three, the paper I found most interesting is Messer's, which is actually the first of two about Husserl's philosophy that share the same title; but the first was published before Ideas one came out, the second after. Messer attempts to carefully reconstruct and vindicate Husserl's vision for phenomenological philosophy as first philosophy -- drawing on Logical Investigations and his programmatic presentation of phenomenology in "Philosophy as a Rigorous Science" (1911) -- while also showing that Husserl's rejection of the methods and deliverances of empirical psychology for phenomenological research are unwarranted. This critical theme is common to all three of these authors. But Messer's paper is to be recommended for his clarity of presentation and better understanding of Husserl's project. Thus, this work represents is one of the earliest and most coherent attempts to naturalize Husserlian phenomenology, in the sense pursued in contemporary phenomenological philosophy (cf., Petitot et al. 1999). I will have more to say about Messer's and Cohn's criticisms below, in relation to the criticism of Heinrich Maier and Husserl's response to it.

Part 2 is, in my view, a much more interesting read overall, especially for those interested in the initial critical reception of Husserl's Ideas and its impact on Husserl's philosophical development. Part 2 contains focused, critical discussions of Husserl's views in the Ideas, the focus of which differs in interesting ways from many contemporary discussions of themes in the Ideas and his philosophical development thereafter. Where contemporary scholars have spilled much ink writing about the nature of Husserl's transcendental idealism and his conception of the noema, these first critics focus on the position of phenomenology in relation to psychology, the purported distinctiveness and independence of its methods, and the priority Husserl claims for it amongst the sciences as a whole.

This is illustrated well in the first selection, Maier's short "Psychology and Philosophy." Maier presented this at the sixth meeting of the Society of Experimental Psychology in April, 1914, and a brief transcript of the discussion among the participants after the talk is included -- recording responses from Husserl, Wilhelm Jerusalem, Elsenhans and others. In the translator's introduction to the piece, Rodney Parker notes Husserl's disdain for Maier and his philosophical views. He quotes Husserl's remark about Maier in a letter to Paul Natorp that "he is no philosopher, as his thick and terrible book on emotional thinking all too clearly proves" (p. 229) -- a remark not altogether surprising, since Maier was a hardcore empiricist, who thought that reliance on any purely a priori methodologies, such as those employed in Husserl's phenomenology, is philosophically hopeless.

Maier attempts to show that "psychology is inextricably connected to the most genuine tasks of philosophy" (p. 235). First, according to him, logic is the "critical science of the norms and the ideal forms of valid thinking" (p. 233). It is indebted to empirical psychology insofar as these cognitive norms are ultimately rooted in the nature and structure of human desires, which is the proper object of empirical psychology (p. 233) -- this being a form of psychologism about logic that Husserl famously criticized in his Prolegomena to the Logical Investigations (1900-01). Maier claims that epistemology's "central question is the problem of being about which realism and idealism quarrel" (p. 235). And it attempts to explain the possibility of knowledge in a "transcendental," not empirical, register insofar as it questions the validity of all givens whatsoever (ibid.). But insofar as epistemology's object is to transcendentally explain cases of "actual knowledge," then it too must rely on empirical psychology to isolate and identify this set of mental acts before epistemology sets to work. Finally, metaphysics, insofar as it relies on epistemology in a broadly Kantian manner -- being nothing more than a theory of the whole of the reality that is given in cases of actual knowledge -- therefore also relies on empirical psychology to the same degree as epistemology (pp. 235-36).

In discussion, Husserl responds to Maier's conception of the psychological grounding of philosophy with the remark:

I cannot here give detailed reasons as to why I cannot, in principle, go along with Prof. Maier. I must limit myself to stating that pure phenomenology (in the sense of my work) is neither descriptive psychology nor does it contain anything of psychology -- as little as pure mathematics of materiality, especially pure geometry, contains anything of physics. Psychology and physics are "factual sciences," sciences of the real world [using the German "real," which, in Husserl, means having a spatio-temporal mode of being]. Pure phenomenology, however, along with geometry and some similar science, are "sciences of essences", sciences of purely ideal possibilities. For these sciences, the existence of reality [Realität] is not a question, therefore, never and nowhere a theme of assessment. . . . Analogous to how pure geometry is the study of the essence of "pure" spaces, or rather the science of ideal possible spatial forms, pure phenomenology is the study of the essence of "pure" consciousness, the science of the ideal possible forms of consciousness, along with their "immanent correlates." (p. 236)

The upshot for Maier's argument for empiricism is clear: since pure phenomenology takes as its object the ideal possibilities of experience, not only is it not indebted to empirical psychology in the way that Maier suggests logic, epistemology and metaphysics are, but the dependence in the case of phenomenology is actually reversed. For insofar as pure phenomenology outlines the kinds of possible experience, clarifying the basic concepts of empirical psychology, then empirical psychology cannot even so much as understand what it is investigating unless it assumes the kind of knowledge that phenomenology is supposed to deliver. The task of empirical psychology, then, is to take up the clarified framework of ideal possibilities and, by empirical testing and observation, determine which of these ideal possibilities is actually realized in the world.

This exchange touches upon the nape-nerve of the debate between Husserl and those critics eager to place psychology on a par with phenomenology or for all other branches of philosophy. This nape-nerve is the possibility of an intuitive "intuition" or "discernment" of essence (Wesensanschauung, Wesenserschauung) and its applications in analysis of consciousness. If the very concept of an intuition of the pure essence of consciousness is incoherent -- as Elsenhans suggests (pp. 348-49) -- or if it is epistemologically problematic except when utilized with some grounding in empirical intuition -- as Cohn (pp. 139-40) and Messer maintain -- then phenomenology is, at most, only a supplementary methodology of empirical psychology. Thus, what's limited here is not the utility of phenomenology to the psychologist, but the philosophical ambitions of phenomenology, as Husserlians understood it. Husserl saw in pure phenomenology the tools for first philosophy, a science that will clarify the basic conceptual repertoire and structure of all the sciences. While Cohn, Messer, and Maier would insist that it is nothing more than a supplementary tool in the empirical psychologist's repertoire.

This is perhaps why the other distinctively Husserlian doctrines in the Ideas that have received a lot of attention in the recent Anglophone literature on Husserl are not prominent here. For while many recent Husserlians are eager to portray phenomenology as a tool of use in interdisciplinary psychological research, Husserl was eager to portray it as a novel and superior way of doing philosophy.

A more thoroughgoing review -- without limits on length -- would discuss in more detail the clear and insightful criticism of Ideas offered by Natorp, which criticizes the "static" nature of Husserl's descriptions, thereby highlighting the limits of pure phenomenological description as a new mode of foundational philosophizing. It would also highlight the important lines of continuity and subtle points of difference between Husserlian transcendental idealism and the neo-Kantian transcendental idealism of Natorp. And it would comment on Messer's, Heinrich Gustav Steinmann's, and Paul F. Linke's careful reconstructions of Husserl's views, and what Husserl's responses to these indicate was lacking in them -- all found in Part 2 of the book. Alas, this cannot be.

However, I do want to make room for one more point: this book represents two important shifts that are still underway in Anglophone scholarship on Husserl. The first is an important shift towards more thoroughgoing historiographical investigation that brings the specific historical context to bear in interpreting and evaluating Husserl's thought -- a shift that blurs the once clearer lines between specialists in phenomenology and other trends in early European philosophy. The other is, as one will notice, a shift towards the prominence of a new generation of Husserl scholars and the great promise that they hold. Almost all the contributors -- even one of the editors -- are "early career" scholars. (A quick Google search shows that Staiti finished his Ph.D. in 2009 and Clarke in 2014; so Staiti is the most senior of the group). If this kind of work is representative of the new generation of Husserl scholars, then I think that we have much to look forward to.


Fink, Eugen. 1933. "Die Phänomenologische Philosophie Edmund Husserls in Der Gegenwärtigen Kritik." Kant-Studien 38 (1-2): 319-83.

Heidegger, Martin. 1985. History of the Concept of Time. Indiana University Press.

Husserl, Edmund. 2014. Ideas for a Pure Phenomenology and Phenomenological Philosophy: First Book: General Introduction to Pure Phenomenology. Hackett.

Levinas, Emmanuel. 1995. The Theory of Intuition in Husserl's Phenomenology. Northwestern University Press.

Petitot, Jean, Francisco J. Varela, Bernard Pachoud and Jean-Michel Roy, eds. 1999. Naturalizing Phenomenology. Stanford University Press.

[1] For a brief discussion of the status of the Ideas in Husserl scholarship and the recent re-awakening of interest in it, see pp. 1–3.