The Space of Culture: Towards a Neo-Kantian Philosophy of Culture (Cohen, Natorp, and Cassirer)

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Sebastian Luft, The Space of Culture: Towards a Neo-Kantian Philosophy of Culture (Cohen, Natorp, and Cassirer), Oxford University Press, 2015, 262pp., $74.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780198738848.

Reviewed by Samantha Matherne, University of California, Santa Cruz


Although recently an increasing amount of attention has been directed to the philosophy of Ernst Cassirer, the same cannot be said of the Marburg Neo-Kantian movement that he was a part of. The work of its founding members, Hermann Cohen and Paul Natorp, remains in relative philosophical neglect and on the occasions that Marburg Neo-Kantianism is discussed, it is typically characterized as a form of Neo-Kantianism that is oriented exclusively towards the mathematical-natural sciences (Naturwissenschaften) and thus contrasted with the Southwest School of Neo-Kantianism, which is (allegedly) focused exclusively on the humanities (Geisteswissenschaften).

Sebastian Luft aims to undermine both of these tendencies. Against the scientistic reading of Marburg Neo-Kantianism, Luft claims that what was of primary interest to Cohen, Natorp, and Cassirer was defending a transcendental philosophy of culture. Hence Luft extends Cassirer's slogan to the whole Marburg school: the critique of reason becomes the critique of culture. And against the tendency to forget this movement, Luft argues that the Marburg philosophy of culture is a candidate to be taken seriously in our philosophical discussions of culture today.

However, in addition to clarifying the nature and relevance of the Marburg approach to culture, Luft has another goal that pertains more directly to Cassirer, viz., showing that Cassirer's philosophy as a whole belongs to Marburg Neo-Kantianism. In contrast with Cassirer scholars who only treat Cassirer's early work on mathematics and science, e.g., Substance and Function (1910), as motivated by Marburg Neo-Kantianism and regard his later work on culture, e.g., in The Philosophy of Symbolic Forms (1923, 1925, 1929), as constituting a break with the Marburg school, Luft maintains that Cassirer's overarching philosophical project cannot be properly understood unless we see it as a development, indeed, the culmination of the philosophy of culture that is at the heart of the Marburg Neo-Kantian movement.

Luft's book thus makes a significant contribution not only to our understanding of Marburg Neo-Kantianism and its continued viability, but also to our appreciation of Cassirer and his relationship to the philosophical school he emerged from.

The book is divided into two parts. In Part One, Luft analyzes the 'basic position' of Marburg Neo-Kantianism, as it is first conceived of by Cohen (Ch. 1) and then developed by Natorp (Ch. 2). In Part Two, Luft turns to Cassirer, first, presenting Cassirer's system of symbolic formation (Ch. 3) and then taking up various metaphilosophical issues that his system gives rise to (Ch. 4).

In his discussion of Cohen, Luft lays particular emphasis on what he takes to be foundational to the Marburg approach to culture, viz., the transcendental method. Following Kant's analytic method from the Prolegomena, the transcendental method, as Luft details, is a method of philosophy that starts with the factum of science and then seeks to reconstruct the conditions of the possibility of this factum. According to Luft, although Cohen originally employs this method to elucidate the factum of Newtonian physics (i.e., of 'experience' in Cohen's terms), Cohen conceives of this method as one that should be employed with respect to the factum of all sciences of culture, e.g., the science of jurisprudence, art, religion, etc. Luft suggests that Cohen's method, in turn, lays the groundwork for the critical approach to culture that the Marburg Neo-Kantians embrace, which turns on offering both a description and a normative justification of the facts of culture.

In pursuing this project, Luft claims that Cohen commits himself to a position that can be characterized as 'dynamic constructivism' (68). According to Luft, Cohen's view is constructivist because the conditions of possibility that the transcendental method uncovers are the laws of pure thinking that serve as the basis for the construction of reality. However, Luft sees this as a dynamic form of constructivism because he thinks Cohen understands these logical laws along the lines of what Michael Friedman has called the 'dynamic a priori'. Rather than conceiving of these laws as static and fixed for all time, Cohen treats them as constitutive only relative to the status quo of a particular science and constantly evolving as the relevant science evolves (66).

Yet in spite of these contributions, Luft suggests that Cohen's approach nevertheless remains limited because he is wedded to a certain version of scientism, to be sure, not in the sense that it is only science that matters to Cohen, but rather in the sense that he analyzes all other cultural formations along scientific lines, i.e., starting with the factum of the relevant science (the science of jurisprudence, the science of art history, etc.) and then analyzing the logical laws that underlies it.

Reacting against this restriction, Luft claims that Natorp contributes to the Marburg philosophy of culture insofar as he broadens the transcendental method by applying it to the subjective life of consciousness. According to Luft, this project, which is at the core of Natorp's transcendental psychology, involves transforming the transcendental method into a 'reconstructive method', which Natorp thinks allows us to reconstruct the immediate life of consciousness, not as an object of science, but rather as something irreducibly subjective. With this extension of the transcendental method, Luft suggests, Natorp breaks with Cohen's scientism, disavowing the privilege of the method of science, and coming, instead, to recognize the science-oriented method as but one method among others for investigating the conditions of the possibility of culture.

Luft claims that Natorp, though originally optimistic about transcendental psychology, eventually comes to believe that the objectification of consciousness is inevitable and so abandons it in favor of two new, related projects that occupy him in the last phase of his career. In the first, Natorp seeks to develop an account of General Logic that reflects the laws of constructing objects in general and that, in turn, serves as the basis of the specific logics that govern each cultural region. In the second, Natorp becomes interested in an account of Poiesis as the creative origin of subjects and objects. However, according to Luft, Natorp conceives of Poiesis in mystical and noumenal terms and so with this last step parts ways with Kant and his Marburg collaborators.

Turning to Cassirer in Part Two, Luft aims to show that Cassirer's philosophy of culture cannot be understood apart from the Marburg context he details in Part One. To this end, he suggests that Cassirer employs the transcendental method and also embraces the notions of the dynamic a priori, constructivism, and Poiesis (without its mystical underpinnings) in his philosophy of culture. However, on Luft's interpretation, Cassirer re-conceives of the philosophy of culture as the philosophy of symbolic formation and in so doing advances the Marburg position in significant and innovative ways.

To begin, Luft suggests that by making the notion of a symbol rather than the notion of a law central to his philosophy of culture, Cassirer is able to avoid the remnants of logicism in Cohen and Natorp. To this end, Luft traces the development of Cassirer's concept of the symbol (through his engagement with Natorp's notion of Poiesis, Warburg and myth, Goethe's conception of a primal phenomenon (Urphänomen), and the discussion of function in Substance and Function), in order to establish the symbol as a more encompassing notion that can do justice to the plurality and irreducibility of the symbolic forms that shape culture.

Thus, according to Luft, one of the most attractive features of Cassirer's philosophy of culture is its pluralism. On Luft's interpretation, for Cassirer, the symbolic forms are plural in the sense that they each have their own irreducible logic, which must, in turn, be analyzed through a plurality of methods. However, Luft argues that this pluralism is closely connected to what he labels Cassirer's 'complementarism', i.e., to the view that each of the symbolic forms represents a different but equally valid viewpoint from which we symbolically construct reality. Luft claims that this, in turn, lays the ground for Cassirer's specific version of idealism, which Luft calls 'symbolic idealism', according to which there is no direct access to the world because the world itself is mediated and constructed through the plurality of the symbolic forms.

After explicating Cassirer's philosophy of culture as a philosophy of symbolic formation, Luft presents and attempts to adjudicate many of the core metaphilosophical issues that are raised by Cassirer's system, including questions about the number, relation, and order of the symbolic forms; the relationship between philosophy and the symbolic forms; and the role of morality in Cassirer's philosophy. I can here mention only one of the important themes Luft pursues in this discussion: his denial that Cassirer accords mathematics and science a privileged status in culture, as the end that culture progresses towards. According to Luft (who acknowledges that this is one of his most contentious moves), although from within, mathematics and science claim a privileged status for themselves as the only universally valid forms, when seen from without, mathematics and science are properly understood as complementary to the other symbolic forms and hence have a horizontal, not a vertical relationship to them.

Though there is much to be sympathetic to in The Space of Culture, in what follows, I want to explore four concerns I have about the position Luft defends. First, it was not ultimately clear to me how strong a version of idealism Luft thinks we should attribute to the Marburg Neo-Kantians. On the one hand, his emphasis on the constructivist themes running throughout Cohen, Natorp, and Cassirer seems to support a very robust version of idealism, according to which "There is no independent existence of the world, but the world exists for us only insofar as we experience it" (183). And this is perhaps what one would expect given the Marburg Neo-Kantians' denial of Kant's two-stem doctrine, i.e., of sensibility as independent from the understanding. On the other hand, Luft, at times, indicates that the Marburg Neo-Kantians think that we construct our cultural world on the basis of a nature we are passive with respect to. This is suggested, for example, in Luft's discussion of Cohen: "Culture is, to Cohen, nothing but creative activity which constructs reality over and above brute nature, in which the human being is entirely passive" (70). This is perhaps also intimated in Luft's analysis of Cassirer's famous example of a curved line, where he claims that, for Cassirer, the different symbolic forms represent "plural viewpoints on the same object" (167). This second line of thought would perhaps better accord with Kant's own critical version of idealism, which is compatible with empirical realism and which he claims does not "concern the existence of things . . . but only the sensory representation of things" (Prolegomena 4:293). I had the sense that Luft was more inclined to attribute the more robust version of idealism to the Marburg Neo-Kantians, indeed, he even calls Cassirer's idealism 'absolute idealism' (e.g., 206, 235). However, I worry that this move not only renders Marburg idealism in too anti-Kantian terms, but also that this is something Cassirer, at least, would not agree to for he says, "all of us, I think, are empirical realists" ("Language and Art II," 195).[1]

The second set of issues I want to raise concerns the role of psychology in Marburg Neo-Kantianism. To begin, on Luft's interpretation, Natorp's foray into transcendental psychology is one that Cohen would have disapproved of because Cohen thinks that, "an account of the life of the subject is impossible without lapsing into a psychological, that is, empirical account of subjectivity" (94). However, as Luft also notes, Cohen had planned (though never completed) a fourth and final volume of his System of Philosophy to be devoted to psychology. Though Luft maintains that this "would have had little to do with Natorp's psychology as assessing the life of consciousness," it is not clear to me that we should so sharply delimit Cohen's approach to psychology from Natorp's (94, fn38). According to Cohen, the fourth volume of his System was to be concerned with "the teaching of man in the unity of his cultural consciousness, as the development of this unity and the genetic connection of all its features and their embryos," a project that does not, on the face of it, seem all that different from Natorp's transcendental psychology (Cohen (1914): 11, transl. Poma (1997): 153).

Moreover, pursuing how Cohen's and Natorp's conceptions of psychology influence Cassirer's philosophy of culture, especially his analysis of the three functions of consciousness, i.e., the expressive, representative, and significative functions (Ausdrucksfunktion, Darstellungsfunktion, Bedeutungsfunktion), in the third volume of The Philosophy of Symbolic Forms, seems to be something that would have strengthened Luft's case for situating Cassirer within the Marburg tradition. However, while Luft emphasizes the influence of the last phase of Natorp's philosophy, i.e., his conception of General Logic and Poiesis, on Cassirer,[2] he does not explore in detail the influence of Natorp's transcendental psychology and reconstructive method,[3] let alone of Cohen's psychology, on Cassirer's conception of the three functions of consciousness, which are foundational to his view of the conditions of culture.[4]

The third issue relates to Luft's analysis of the Marburg conception of the a priori and general logic. According to Luft, one of the unifying features of the Marburg approach to logic is its embrace of the dynamic a priori. Unlike Kant with his two fixed forms of intuition and twelve fixed categories, Luft suggests that the Marburg Neo-Kantians conceive of the a priori in open-ended terms and as something that is constitutive only relative to a particular cultural region at a particular time. Though it seems to me that certain concepts or forms might be a priori in this dynamic and relative sense, I am not sure that the Marburg Neo-Kantians conceive of all concepts or forms along these lines. Rather it seems that Cohen, Natorp, and Cassirer are each interested in a general logic,[5] the subject matter of which is the basic a priori categories, forms, or relations, which remain fixed and underwrite culture as a whole. This, indeed, appears to be the picture that Cassirer has in mind in The Philosophy of Symbolic Forms, where he argues that there are certain "basic relations which constitute the unity of consciousness," like space, time, and causality, and that these relations are assigned "a special "index of modality,"" in each of the symbolic forms (PSFv1 97). While Luft takes this sort of move to be evidence that Cassirer pluralizes Kant's categories (136), it seems to me that it is perhaps better read as evidence that Cassirer thinks that there are fixed a priori relations, which take on a specific modality in each symbolic form, and that this would be the concern of a Marburg-style general logic.

The final issue I want to take up concerns Luft's interpretation of teleology and the relationship between the symbolic forms in Cassirer's philosophy of culture. At times, Luft insists that Cassirer's philosophy of culture is ateleological.[6] This, indeed, is a crucial component of Luft's analysis of the complementary, horizontal relationship among the symbolic forms, such that no one form is elevated over the other forms. Yet, at other times, Luft acknowledges that Cassirer thinks that there is a "general purpose of culture," viz., "the further emancipation and humanization of culture" (212). This, in turn, plays an important role in his discussion of Cassirer's synthesis of Kant and Hegel in his ethical conception of culture as involving "the progress of the consciousness of freedom" (230). However, if Cassirer is committed to there being a purpose to culture, then it seems he is thereby committed to a teleological picture of culture. And this teleological picture would, in turn, provide grounds for ranking certain symbolic forms over others if they enable us to progress closer towards this goal. Indeed, this seems to be what motivates Cassirer in ranking mathematics and science so highly in the third volume of The Philosophy of Symbolic Forms. For, on his view, they put us in a position to become conscious of the relations by means of which we organize the world, and given that these relations are expressions of our freedom, mathematics and science thereby enable us to increase our consciousness of our freedom, hence advance culture in a crucial way. Since a symbolic form like myth does not do this, but rather gives us the illusion that we are passive with respect to the world, then Cassirer would have reason to say, as he does, that mathematics and science are the highest rungs on the ladder of culture.

Critical considerations aside, however, Luft has written an important book that takes much needed steps towards clarifying the commitments and consequence of Marburg Neo-Kantianism as a philosophy of culture.


Cassirer, Ernst. The Philosophy of Symbolic Forms. Volume One: Language. Trans. Ralph Manheim. Yale University Press, 1953. [PSFv1]

-- The Philosophy of Symbolic Forms. Volume Two: Mythical Thought. Trans. Ralph Manheim. Yale University Press, 1955. [PSFv2]

-- The Philosophy of Symbolic Forms. Volume Three: The Phenomenology of Knowledge. Trans. Ralph Manheim. Yale University Press, 1957. [PSFv3]

-- "Language and Art II." In Symbol, Myth, and Culture, ed. Donald Verene: 166-195. Yale University Press, 1979.

Cohen, Hermann. Einleitung mit kritischem Nachtrag zu F. A. Langes Geschichte des Materialismus (3rd edition). Baedeker, 1914.

Kant, Immanuel. Prolegomena to Any Future Metaphysics. Transl. Gary Hatfield. Cambridge University Press, 1997.

Matherne, Samantha. "Marburg Neo-Kantianism as Philosophy of Culture." In The Philosophy of Ernst Cassirer: A Novel Assessment, ed. Sebastian Luft and Tyler Friedman. de Gruyter, 2015.

Poma, Andrea. The Critical Philosophy of Hermann Cohen. Trans. John Denton. SUNY Press, 1997.

[1] Cassirer goes on to say, "Man is surrounded by a reality that he did not make, that he has to accept as an ultimate fact. But it is for him to interpret reality . . . and this is performed in different ways in the various human activities, in religion and art, in science and philosophy."

[2] Luft addresses the three functions of consciousness in the context of discussing Cassirer's version of Natorp's General Logic (179-80).

[3] See, e.g., Cassirer's discussion of Natorp's transcendental psychology and reconstructive method in Ch. 1 of PSFv3 ('Subjective and Objective Analysis'): 51-57, where Cassirer indicates that he intends to use the reconstructive method to uncover the functions of consciousness that underwrite the symbolic forms (PSFv3 57).

[4] For a more detailed discussion of these issues and the role of psychology in Marburg Neo-Kantianism, see Matherne (2015).

[5] I have in mind here Cohen's logic of origin, Natorp's General Logic, and Cassirer's analysis of the basic relations that pertain to symbolic consciousness in general (see, e.g., PSFv1 94-97, PSFv2 60-61).

[6] For example, Luft says, "Cassirer's Hegelianism is Hegel sans teleology" and that, "Symbolic idealism is . . . a form of absolute idealism, without the teleological aspect" (174, 235).