The Species Problem: A Philosophical Analysis

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Richard A. Richards, The Species Problem: A Philosophical Analysis, Cambridge University Press, 2010, 236pp., $89.00 (hbk), ISBN 9780521196833.

Reviewed by Andrew Hamilton, Arizona State University


There are four books on my shelf and countless papers in my electronic and physical files with the title "The Species Problem." Many of these were written by philosophers, but almost as many were written by biologists. To my knowledge, the earliest to take up the species problem by that name confronts the nasty case of corals and dates to 1926 (Hoffmeister 1926). None of the books and papers on this topic contains anything like a consensus solution. Looking over these materials again, it's clear that it is past time for a fundamental rethinking of what the problem is supposed to be, whose problem it is, and whether we really need to solve it. I suspect that 'the species problem' neither has a solution nor is really as much of a problem as many have thought.

Others have discussed Richards' book and proposed solution in some detail (Velasco 2011, Wilkins 2012, Kober forthcoming). I see no need to duplicate their efforts. Richards' basic move is to distinguish between theoretical and operational formulations of the problem, then to adopt a version of the view that species are lineage segments as a way to offer a theoretical definition. On this distinctly phylogenetic way of thinking of species, particular species begin and end with speciation events (Hamilton 2011). Richards points out correctly that the lineage-segments approach, which was developed by Kevin de Quieroz and Richard Mayden, has much going for it in terms of ontology, as it draws on the idea that species are individuals. This is just to say that they are things rather than kinds of things. So far so good.

As a solution to 'the' problem or as a theory-based definition, however, Richards' strategy isn't going to work. Not only has no consensus emerged from the lineage-segments approach in the decade and a half since it was first defended, but the de Quieroz and Mayden line has a problem that Richards neglects: in solving one problem, it creates another. While it may be true, as de Quieroz (1998) has argued, that all contemporary species concepts pick out population-level evolutionary lineages, they do so in different and often incompatible ways. Agreeing that species are lineage segments goes no distance toward helping to find the boundaries or to settle the host of arguments about what boundaries to seek. This approach swaps one hard question (what are species?) for another (what's an evolutionary individual?), as is the case with most or all of the other proposed solutions to date.

Having rejected the solution, I would now like to reject the problem. Much furor in the species debates is fueled by the concern that without a theoretical definition, we have no idea what we're doing. How can we do any work at all if we don't have a clear definition of what we're working on? As ornithologist C. J. Hazevoet put this idea in 1996, "the entire theoretical and empirical structure of comparative biology depends on how species . . . are conceived." I don't think this is quite right, partly because of the kind of cut between theoretical and operational thinking that Richards defends.

In telling us why we should care about the species problem, Richards follows Jody Hey (2001) and many others in pointing out that the most troubling worry is that if we use one species definition as opposed to another, we may get dramatically different species counts. Then where will we be? We'll have no idea what sense to make of biodiversity claims, and we may be forever damned to compare apples and oranges when we read the work of different researchers or when we make comparisons across groups whose evolutionary histories are even a little different.

There is likely at least one book in the works on this topic, and probably several. I'd like to suggest that before those authors offer their conceptual solutions, we take a page from Richards' book and think hard about the operational side of species-based biology. Is the truism that species concepts have a direct bearing on species counts really true? Is it the case that without a unified concept we have no idea what to make of the 20,000 or so new species that are described each year or the two million described to date? Putting this another way, when we pay the kind of attention to operations -- scientific practice -- that we have paid to theory, what do we find?

This is not a rhetorical question. I don't know the answer, but I do suspect strongly that there is not as tight a connection between theory and practice in this case as some have imagined. It is an empirical question whether changes in species ideas over time or differences in species ideas across researchers have a significant impact on species counts. Richards cites data from a wonderfully interesting 2004 study by Paul Agapow and colleagues in which it is claimed that uses of the phylogenetic species concept result in very large increases in species numbers for many groups. This makes intuitive sense: use a finer strainer and you will get a different consistency. The problem is that it seems not to be true.

While it is the case that the particular researchers Agapow et al. studied -- and who, by the way, are mostly not taxonomists -- came up with many more species using the phylogenetic concept than had been recognized previously, this is not the same thing as an increase in species number. An increase in species number requires much more than the publication of a paper in which the author claims to have found many more species of this or that taxon. An increase in species number of the scale in the Agapow study is unlikely because the taxonomists who describe, voucher, and name the specimens tend to be conservative in these matters. Their practice has its own set of rules and concepts that are often independent of and may mediate the effects of using particular species concepts.

A quick look at the taxonomic literature shows some evidence for this view: by and large there have not been the increases in named species that one would have predicted based on the Agapow study. A more in-depth analysis that I am now conducting points to the same conclusion about species concepts as against species numbers over time. For instance, it seems not to be the case that thousands of names for morphological variants were synonymized when Ernst Mayr convinced many that the morphological species concept should be replaced with his interbreeding concept in the 1940s. Indeed, it seems that what changes is the justification, not the named species.

I am not claiming that there is no count problem. I am also not claiming that species concepts have no bearing on species counts or that there is never concern by domain experts over how to define species. On the contrary, there are cases in which concepts have mattered a great deal for counts and for basic grouping. Hoffmeister's corals are an example, as is the mind-boggling specious phylum Foraminifera, for which concepts have been a difficulty more recently (Holtzmann 2000). I am claiming that taxonomic practice may go a long way toward obviating whatever difficulties result from differences in species concepts, especially within taxonomic groups. How much this is the case remains to be studied, but this is just my point. My strong sense is that there ultimately will be a much higher payoff from doing more work to understand how species theory and practice relate to one another than from continuing to offer solutions to what may turn out not to be a stand-alone problem.

Whatever the fate of his solution to the species problem, Richards has offered us something valuable in his book. The distinction between theoretical and operational questions is not original to him, but he contextualizes it well, showing where the two lines of thought diverge in history and in conceptual space. Richards has also given us a roadmap to the arguments dating back to Aristotle, showing where ideas have been conflated and where commentators have talked past one another. This will be an important foundation for taking productive next steps, which I have argued may be in the direction of bringing theory and operation back together again. This attempt to change the subject is not a criticism of Richards. It is standard practice in philosophy and in biology to treat theory and practice separately and to accord pride of place to theory. There is much to gain from breaking this habit.


Agapow, P.-M., Bininda-Emonds, O., Crandall, K., Gittleman, J. L., Mace, G., Marshall, J., and Purvis, A. 2004. "The Impact of Species Concept on Biodiversity."  Quarterly Review of Biology, 79: 161-179.

de Quieroz, K. 1998. "The General Lineage Concept of Species, Species Criteria, and the Process of Speciation: A Conceptual Unification and Terminological Recommendations. In D. J. Howard and S. H. Berlocher, eds., Endless Forms: Species and Speciation. Oxford: Oxford University Press, 57-75.

Hazevoet, C. J. 1996. "Conservation and Species Lists: Taxonomic Neglect Promotes the Extinction of Endemic Birds, as Exemplified by Taxa from Eastern Atlantic Islands." Bird Conservation International, 6: 181-196.

Hamilton, A. 2011. "From Types to Individuals: Hennig's Ontology and the Development of Phylogenetic Systematics." Cladistics, 27: 1-11.

Hey, Jody. 2001. Genes, Categories and Species: The Evolutionary and Cognitive Causes of the Species Problem. Oxford: Oxford University Press.

Hoffmeister, J. E. 1926. "The Species Problem in Corals." American Journal of Science, 5: 151-156.

Holtzmann, M. 2000. "Species Concept in Foraminifera: Ammonia as a Case Study." Micropaleontology, 46, Supplement 1: Advances in the Biology of Foraminifera: 21-37.

Kober, G. Forthcoming. "Review Essay of Richard A. Richards, The Species Problem: A Philosophical Analysis." HOPOS: The Journal of the International Society for the History of Philosophy of Science.

Velasco, J. 2011. Review of The Species Problem: A Philosophical Analysis. The Philosophical Review, 120: 598-602.

Wilkins, J. 2012. Review of The Species Problem: A Philosophical Analysis. Systematic Biology, 61: 362-363.